Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted: Dialogues with Existentialism, Pragmatism, Critical Theory, and Postmodernism

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Paul Fairfield, Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted: Dialogues with Existentialism, Pragmatism, Critical Theory, and Postmodernism, Continuum, 2011, 263pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441116383.

Reviewed by Vincent M. Colapietro, Pennsylvania State University


This book appeared as part of a series entitled Continuum Studies in Continental Philosophy (though now the series is with Bloomsbury Publishing). At the time of its publication, the series included over thirty titles (from Adorno to Žižek, with Deleuze, Derrida, Heidegger, and Nietzsche generously represented). Most of these other books are devoted to a single figure, though some are comparisons between two or three thinkers. In this respect, at least, Paul Fairfield's book is markedly different from the other ones in the series.

In some respects Fairfield's book is extremely ambitious, in others quite modest. This ambition is nowhere more evident than in its scope given its length. In little more than 225 pages, Fairfield considers four major philosophical developments and twelve important figures (three figures in each of these movements or traditions). Its modesty is perhaps most discernible in his desire to remain faithful to the animating spirit of the hermeneutic approach, as exemplified by Hans-Georg Gadamer and Paul Ricoeur, but to venture only "a step or two beyond its letter" (5). His substantive focus is on "interpretation, reason, truth, inquiry and related notions" (5). While critique is one of the related notions, it is conspicuous by its absence in the list of notions deemed important enough to identify explicitly (a point to which I will return below). Though not comparable in quality to these works, anyone familiar with Richard J. Bernstein's Praxis and Action: Contemporary Philosophies of Human Activity (1971), Beyond Objectivism and Relativism: Science, Hermeneutics, and Praxis (1985), or The New Constellation: The Ethical-Political Horizons of Modernity/Postmodernity (1992) will be familiar with the genre of philosophical writing to which this book is a contribution. While in Bernstein's books the voices of the philosophers being engaged are dramatically resonant, in Fairfield's they are less audible (in some instances, far less audible). Like Bernstein, however, Fairfield painstakingly and accessibly explicates the substance of the texts he engages.

Fairfield is the author of (among an impressive number of other books) Education After Dewey (2012) and a co-editor of John Dewey and Continental Philosophy (2010). One of his earlier books (Theorizing Praxis, 2000) bears the subtitle Studies in Hermeneutical Pragmatism. The subtitle of the book under review might have been Studies in Speculative Hermeneutics, since in Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted he is in effect speculating about how a number of thinkers might be cast as hermeneutical philosophers, imagining what (given what they did say) they would say in response to questions emerging primarily within the horizon of hermeneutical thought. As the titles of the two works identified at the outset of this paragraph suggest, Fairfield is familiar with Dewey. He is, however, conversant with not only William James and Richard Rorty but also an array of Continental European authors. For Dewey himself, moreover, the sign of conjunction (the deceptively simple word and) is arguably, the most important one in many of his titles (e.g., Experience and Nature, Culture and Freedom, The School and Society, The Public and Its Problems). Fairfield himself is a conjunctive thinker (recall John Dewey and Continental Philosophy), striving imaginatively to conjoin what others would keep separate or simply never imagine should be brought together.

As I have already indicated, the task of conjunction undertaken in Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted is, at least substantively considered, ambitious. It is, thematically (doctrinally?) considered, more modest, since it tries to do nothing more than take a step or two beyond the letter of Gadamer's and Ricoeur's pronouncements (5). This gifted author takes his main contribution to be engaging with figures and traditions not ordinarily taken seriously by the central representatives of the hermeneutic tradition; and in this Fairfield is certainly right. This might itself have been made a topos, for the question of why thinkers within this tradition, so disposed to celebrate the ideal of openness, have been so resolutely and persistently closed to, say, American thought in general and the pragmatic movement in particular, is a question worthy of careful consideration. What nationalistic, cultural, ethnic, and personal biases are operative here? But, then, hardly any feet are, in this work, held to the fire.

The accessibility of Fairfield's writing is (if anything) even more impressive than the scope of his concern. Moreover, the irenic character of his hermeneutical sensibility is arguably the most striking trait of this multifaceted study: while taking pains to avoid blurring or, worse, erasing differences (while indeed stressing, not infrequently, that his intention is not to blur or erase differences, especially "irreconcilable philosophical differences" [4]), his dominant impulse is to unearth previously unnoticed affinities. Finally, he wants, above all else, to discover (for example) the respects in which American pragmatism is akin to the hermeneutic tradition, rather than the ways in which hermeneutic thinkers are pragmatic (though it is of course impossible to separate the two). Even so, the measuring rod appears to be the hermeneutic orientation. There is certainly nothing wrong with this, except that the asymmetrical relationship implied in this specific hermeneutic approach seems to preclude the possibility of a genuine dialogue, one in which the radical impulses of (say) Nietzsche or Dewey or Horkheimer or Jean-François Lyotard might disturb the magisterial confidence of hermeneutical irenism (if I may be granted the desperate expedient of this neologism).

Fairfield is quick to point out that "none of the movements or traditions of thought . . . can be spoken of as unified systems or anything close to it" (3). In some cases, however, the "family resemblances" (3) are so attenuated and vague as to make the reader (at least, this reader) wonder whether the groupings are utter fabrications of the hermeneutic imagination.

He writes:

My aim is neither to speak about existentialism, pragmatism, critical theory and postmodernism from the standpoint of an outsider or as unified philosophies to which hermeneutics may or may not stand opposed, nor is it to overhaul radically the ideas that found expression in [Gadamer's] Truth and Method. (4; emphasis added)

Stated positively, his objective is "to bring these ideas into explicit contact" (4). So, hermeneutics as Fairfield envisions it "is a philosophy of the big tent. Rather more hospitable to its others, and sometimes its critics than what is usual in philosophy, hermeneutics is no dogmatic system of thought but is explicitly dialectical and dialogical" (5). The reason for lifting aloft such a large tent is simple: "ideas benefit from dialogical encounters with their respective others" (3). Closely related to this, there is the conviction that: "We think in the interstices of traditional dichotomies, without ahistorical touchstones, without hard wiring, and rather often without methods" (6).

Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted opens with a brief introduction ("Hermeneutical Engagements"). It is however not altogether clear that Fairfield is actually engaged in the task of reinterpreting hermeneutics. Indeed, the book's subtitle better conveys his purpose: Dialogues with Existentialism, Pragmatism, Critical Theory, and Postmodernism. "Post-Heideggerian hermeneutics," Fairfield readily acknowledges, "has been well articulated by Hans-Georg Gadamer, Paul Ricoeur, and a large number of thinkers working under their influence" (3). But, as I will suggest below, even this might be somewhat misleading, since the chapters are better described as analyses or expositions than dialogues or exchanges.

Part One is devoted to existentialism. It has three chapters, one on Nietzsche's perspectivism, one on Jaspers, and one on Gabriel Marcel. Today Jaspers and Marcel are hardly the usual suspects. Fairfield takes up Nietzsche "as a hermeneuticist, as a philosopher not only of existence but, inseparable from this, of interpretation, perspectivism, genealogy, and historicity" (10). Part Two is devoted to pragmatism with one chapter on each of James, Dewey, and Rorty. Part Three focuses on critical theory. It commences with a treatment of Max Horkheimer, proceeds to a consideration of Jürgen Habermas, and ends with a consideration of Karl-Otto Apel. Part Four treats postmodernism, opening with a chapter on Michel Foucault, turning to one on John Caputo, and concluding with a chapter that engages with Lyotard. The chapter on Lyotard, somewhat surprisingly, concludes the book. At least a brief conclusion counterbalancing the Introduction (1-6) would have been desirable. As it stands, the last chapter of Part Four in effect serves as the conclusion. Perhaps this is not altogether amiss, since the concluding sentences of his appreciative treatment of Lyotard's postmodern project might justly serve as a conclusion for the book in its entirety:

To speak of a judgment that makes no appeal to the absolute does not mean that our prescriptions are now unreasoning or arbitrary. It means that in interpreting what is and judging what ought to be, we participate in the event of truth and in the happening of justice. (229)

Though Fairfield discusses the spirit of hermeneutics only in passing, it is, first and last, deeply akin to that of Heidegger's philosophy, as his concluding sentence of the book unmistakably indicates (though the spirit of Gadamerian hermeneutics is of course hardly separable in critical respects from that of its Heideggerian inspiration). Less ontological perhaps, less preoccupied with questions of existence and being, allegedly more concerned with issues of experience and interpretation (9), "post-Heideggerian hermeneutics," as conceived -- indeed, as enacted -- by Fairfield, is nonetheless discernibly Heideggerian. This is hardly anything Fairfield would deny, given how deeply Gadamerian he is and, in turn, given how resolutely Gadamer himself was to affirming and even celebrating the continuity of tradition, especially in the face of ruptures and displacements.

Fairfield's own summary of his book is worth recalling here, since it adds salient detail to my summation:

the questions that are at stake in Part One include [in the case of Nietzsche] the hermeneutic relevance of perspectivism, [in that of Jaspers] the dialogical nature of reason and [in reference to Marcel] the ethical implications of mass society. Part Two discusses pragmatic conceptions of truth, inquiry and the relation of theory and practice. Part Three examines the nature and the conditions of critical reflection and the possibility of both an ethics and a politics of communication. Finally, the chapters of Part Four inquire into genealogy and suspicion, radical hermeneutics and the nature of ethical judgement. (5)

An irony is that Fairfield takes great pains to do hermeneutic justice to the various perspectives on which he focuses but does not in the least seem to consider some large questions concerning the possibility (one might even argue the likelihood) of doing hermeneutic injustice to these philosophical movements. The best way to make this point is to ask whether critique is, from the perspective of (say) Dewey, Habermas, and Foucault, virtually eclipsed by the focus on interpretation. It is hardly the case that in reference to these and other figures Fairfield ignores the topic of critique -- far from it. But there is, in effect, a subordination of critique to interpretation. Would not the more accurate and fair interpretation of some of the figures be that they were primarily critical philosophers and hermeneutical ones only insofar as interpretation is an indispensable tool of critical thought?

Also, it seems appropriate to ask what, if any, principles of selection were deployed to identify just these movements and why, within each movement or tradition, just these thinkers were chosen for consideration. In terms of their relevance to hermeneutics, Charles Peirce and Josiah Royce are, on the surface at least, much more obvious choices for influential pragmatists whose ideas lend themselves to a critical dialogue with the hermeneutic tradition. But the selections of figures within movements is not as troublesome as the selection of existentialism, pragmatism, critical theory, and postmodernism as the movements most relevant to the task of "reinterpreting" the hermeneutic philosophical tradition at the present time or, more accurately, the task of staging a dialogical exchange between the hermeneutic tradition and other philosophical traditions or orientations. But the others are, with the marked exception of American pragmatism, principally those that have attained respectability among "Continental" philosophers working in North America. Among the younger generation of Continental philosophers, especially in the US and Canada, even pragmatism is given greater respect than that accorded to it by (for example) the founding members of SPEP (Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy). To press this point, nonetheless, Fairfield is convinced that:

Thinking becomes one-sided and narrowed at the same time that it appears well-ordered, and the clear and fortified systems that we construct conceal half the world and lack thinking's essential quality of on-the-wayness. Thinking is [to allow a leitmotiv of this study to sound] dialectical and it is moral, and it profits us to dwell on the conditions that can bring about its decline. (2)

But the inclusive scope of his hermeneutic engagement has apparently blinded Fairfield from appreciating, perhaps even realizing, the unwittingly narrow range of his own thoughtful concerns. The mere mention of feminism, psychoanalysis, critical philosophy of race, and queer studies thrusts into the foreground the extent to which this book is enclosed within the horizon of academic respectability (as such respectability is evident in a distinctive and indeed vibrant subculture of academic philosophy). To take seriously the task of dwelling on the conditions that bring about the decline of thought -- hermeneutical thought at the very least, and insofar as these are different, pragmatic thought, critical thought, and postmodern thought -- requires us to engage the complex relationship between the historical actualities of everyday life and the diverse discourses, academic and otherwise, aiming to bring these actualities into critical focus. Something might be learned, for example, from Marcel's "existentialist" critique of "mass society." But have not the insights from this critique been effectively absorbed into contemporary consciousness? And do not the more subtle forms of human (indeed, environmental) degradation and violence characteristic of our time more urgently demand our attention?

In this and other ways, the unmistakable spirit of hermeneutic philosophy is not itself unmistakably present here. It is, however, certainly not clearly absent. "The letter and spirit of hermeneutics are explicitly dialogical" (4) and, in turn, the dialogical is, at bottom, principally a radical openness to what is irreducibly other. This spirit drives us (at least, those animated by it) toward the engagement with the other as other. There is in the individual analyses a wavering between an exposition of certain figures and engaging in a dialogue with them. The distinctive voices of the individual thinkers are, in other words, insufficiently audible in the chapters devoted to their thought. While great care has been taken to represent or, better, interpret fairly both what these thinkers actually wrote and what they would say in response to certain questions central (or, at least, germane) to hermeneutics, inadequate care has been taken to stage an encounter with these thinkers in their rhetorical singularity and unique historicity.

Let me take pains to be clear: care has been taken by Fairfield in this regard, but philosophical discourse is (like jazz) a communal celebration of the singular voice. The substance of (say) Willard van Orman Quine's claims and the force of his arguments demand our critical attention, perhaps more than anything else, but his singular philosophical voice certainly warrants our appreciation, to no slight degree. Just as the best trained jazz musicians can pass most "blindfold tests" (they can hear a piece of music and identify the musician), so most well trained philosophers can recognize Quine's work. This is also true of work by Heidegger, Cavell, or Davidson, but for the most part not of their progeny and imitators. This is the principal reason there is a problem with  Fairfield's sparing reliance on direct quotation and his consistently even-handed exegeses of the various authors. The irony here is that in his effort to be charitable, virtually all of the writers end up sounding like him. Let me, however, quickly add that Fairfield's own hermeneutic and indeed philosophical voice is distinguished by its painstaking, judicious, balanced, and clear formulations.

Despite these criticisms, it is likely that Fairfield has attained his explicit goal: "The aim of these analyses is both to clarify some outstanding issues, etc." (4). Our understanding of existentialism, pragmatism, critical theory, and postmodernism is richer as a result of his painstaking efforts to interpret these irreducibly diverse perspectives from the perspective of hermeneutic philosophy. In turn, our understanding of this philosophy is itself richer for insights drawn from Nietzsche, Jaspers, Marcel, James, Dewey, Rorty, Horkheimer, Habmeras, Apel, Foucault, Caputo, and Lyotard. Beyond this, his efforts to juxtapose hermeneutics with other traditions somewhat clarify (and in several instances significantly illuminate) a host of issues. These issues, stressed by Fairfield in his Introduction ("interpretation, truth, [and] inquiry"), include: experience, language, valuation (and, inseparably linked to this, transvaluation in its distinctively Nietzschean and other senses), phronesis (hence, deliberation), method, and, indeed critiquet.

But how would Nietzsche, Jaspers, or Marcel; or James, Dewey, or Rorty; or Horkheimer, Habermas, or Apel; or Foucault, Caputo, or Lyotard, themselves respond to Fairfield's Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted? Would they even take the time to read it? While I obviously cannot answer this question, I am confident in speculating that, given the virtues of this book (especially its clarity, accuracy, and sobriety), they might be readily disposed to suggest it to their students. At least, I certainly would not hesitate to recommend it to my students. Beyond this, the book is likely to help those working primarily (or exclusively) in one tradition to see how other thinkers, texts, and traditions are relevant to their work. Finally, this series of studies might shed light for (say) contemporary critical theorists on three central figures in their own philosophical tradition or for (say) postmodernists on aspects of Foucault's or Lyotard's work not sufficiently appreciated. Whatever its defects or shortcomings, Philosophical Hermeneutics Reinterpreted is, without question, an imaginatively conceived, responsibly executed, and truly suggestive project. Do not look within its covers for a reinterpretation of hermeneutics, but do look there for a wider field of hermeneutic engagements than one ordinarily finds.