Philosophical Inquiries into the Essence of Human Freedom

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F.W.J. Schelling, Philosophical Inquiries into the Essence of Human Freedom, tr. Jeff Love and Johannes Schmidt, State University of New York Press, 2006, 183pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 0791468739

Reviewed by Dale E. Snow, Loyola College in Maryland


Philosophical Inquiries into the Essence of Human Freedom, "the most titanic work of German idealism" (Hans Urs von Balthazar) has received a careful new translation from Jeff Love and Johannes Schmidt.  The last of Schelling's major works to be published in his lifetime, the Philosophical Investigations plays a uniquely pivotal role in Schelling's long life of scholarly productivity, at once dependent on the controversies of his youth for the context and vocabulary in which he expresses himself, yet anticipating developments in the ideas of freedom, personality, and the deep-rootedness of the human tendency to evil that were to dominate Western philosophy for the next century.

Love and Schmidt have improved upon James Gutmann's 1936 translation, usually referred to by its brief title, Of Human Freedom, in four important respects:  they provide a more scholarly and philosophically nuanced introduction; the notes are more complete and more useful to first-time readers and scholars alike; six short supplementary texts by authors whose thought was especially influential on Schelling are appended to the translation; and most important of all, the translation is faithful to the point of idiosyncrasy.  If the translators have sometimes made controversial choices, they have defended them well and in a way that illuminates the issues at stake.

Let me address each of these improvements in turn.  It is to be expected that scholars who have the benefit of an additional seventy years of scholarship will be able to create a portrait of Schelling that goes beyond the well-worn "prince of the Romanticists" caricature, and so they have.  Their introduction offers a sketch of the modern notion of theodicy from Leibniz to Hegel, with whom it reaches its most effulgent elaboration.  They do not omit to point out that a common thread in the various theories of the rationality of the world is the now hidden, now explicit drive of modern science to assert authority and control over nature.  Schelling is of course sharply critical of this approach to scientific understanding in his philosophy of nature.  This may have contributed to his receptiveness to the challenges to the traditional concept of theodicy posed by Kant's notion of radical evil.  Love and Schmidt frame Schelling's project in the Philosophical Investigations as a "great gamble," which is intended to "affirm both the project of theodicy and the more powerful concept of evil that Kant developed" (xix).  The third section of the introduction makes a brief attempt to weigh the merits of Schelling's arguments, describe their reception, and even essay a few remarks on the future of theodicy.  Love and Schmidt concede that the theodical impulse in the Philosophical Investigations has largely been ignored or misunderstood, but their introduction does an excellent job of making the case and would be a welcome point of entry for the reader new to Schelling to understand one important way in which he is both a part of the tradition and a considerable departure from it.

The elegant and thoughtfully argued introduction comes at a certain price:  by focusing on presenting Schelling as poised to deal a death blow to one tradition of theodicy, while perhaps inaugurating another, and darker tradition, other important issues are necessarily relegated to the endnotes, where I fear they will not receive the attention they deserve.  One example can be found in the very first endnote to the treatise proper.  It discusses the first edition of the Philosophical Investigations, presents an admirably coherent account of Schelling's earlier philosophical writings, and discusses his self-interpretation as demonstrated by those of his earlier works chosen to be included in what was to have been volume one of a collected edition of his works.  As has often been pointed out, Schelling's own view of his philosophical enterprise often varied spectacularly from the opinions of both contemporaries and later interpreters, and it is vital to allow one so often misrepresented to be heard on this score.  Another significant set of issues I wish had not been confined to an endnote concerns Schelling's epoch-making distinction between being as ground of existence and as existence. As the translators correctly note, "the entire positive argument of the treatise flows from this distinction" (147).  A crucial set of concepts that requires three full pages of endnote space would seem to be crying out to be dealt with in another form.  Aside from these quibbles about the presentation of some of this material, it must be said that the endnotes are extensive, helpful, clear, and explain historical context and translation choices with equal felicity.

The third innovation contained in this volume is the inclusion of the six short supplementary texts, which provide background material for the pantheism controversy of the 1780s and leading examples of theosophical thought.  Especially valuable is the translation of Jacob Boehme's Mysterium Pansophicum, which can be difficult to track down.  Franz Xaver von Baader's "On the Assertion that There Can Be No Wicked Use of Reason" appears here for the first time in English.  Since this text provides such invaluable insights into Schelling's concept of evil, I am tempted to say that it alone is worth the price of admission, if only this did not imply that the other texts are less worthwhile.  The four pantheism controversy texts are Lessing's "The Parable," two excerpts from F. H. Jacobi's so-called Spinoza-Buchlein, and an excerpt from J. G. Herder's God. Some Conversations.  The last is especially welcome, since Herder's influence on German idealism more generally but Schelling in particular has been too little explored in current scholarship.  I am delighted to see the publication of this important material in the same volume with the Philosophical Investigations.  It would have been a service to indicate in the endnotes that there does exist a relatively recent English translation of the Spinoza-Buchlein (Gerard Vallée, The Spinoza Conversations Between Lessing & Jacobi, tr. G. Vallée, J. B. Lawson and C.G. Chappelle, University Press of America, 1988).

Finally, the translation itself is an improvement on previous efforts at this famously difficult text.  The translators have adopted the practice of Thomas Buchheim, editor of the 1987 critical edition, in reproducing the pagination of the German original in both the first edition (OA) and in the still-necessary Sämmtliche Werke edition edited by K.F.A. Schelling (SW).  Their translation is also based on Buchheim's edition.  They have attempted "to retain the genuine flavor of the original" (xxxi) quite successfully, and where this produces curious or awkward-sounding English, have explained their rationale in the notes.  A key change discussed in the "Translator's Note" is the shift from Gutmann's choice of "unruliness" and the "unruly" to translate das Regellose and regellos to "anarchy" and "anarchical."  Since Schelling so clearly meant to raise the most ultimate of metaphysical questions, English words evoking violations of rules do not have the same force as terms which imply a looming threat to the very order of things, as anarchy and its cognates much more clearly do.   Gutmann translates wissenschaftliche Weltansicht as "systematic world view;" Love and Schmidt restore it to the more accurate (and more Schellingian) "scientific worldview."  Gutmann's rendering of physischen Theorie is "theory of physics;" clearly Love and Schmidt's choice of "theory of nature" is closer to the overall sense of the passage.  A number of other changes from Gutmann are not specifically remarked upon in the notes but are nevertheless moves in the direction of greater precision and fidelity to the text.  Occasionally fidelity begets a certain linguistic creativity, such as Love and Schmidt's translation of Mittelpunkt as "centerpoint," a word that does not exist in English (yet).

The Philosophical Investigations deserves the attention it has been receiving in recent Schelling scholarship.  We can take Schelling at his word that this treatise is "the first in which the author puts forth his concept of the ideal part of philosophy with complete determinateness" (4), and still find its enduring importance to be in the many intimations of themes which seem to go definitively beyond traditional idealism in the middle and later works.  Once Schelling has exposed the limitations of the traditional concepts of freedom and its relationship with the possibility of evil, he can begin to defend a much more dynamic understanding of the life and creation of both God and man, what Love and Schmidt describe in a well-chosen phrase as "the pure combat of becoming" (x).  That existence itself is a struggle is of course not original with Schelling.  What he and his criticism of the idealistic tradition force the reader to take seriously is the contemplation of what kind of freedom it is that is constitutive of our humanity, which includes acknowledgement of the horrors attendant on the misuse of that freedom.  These are topics no thoughtful person can ever be satisfied that he has fully grasped.  This well-executed translation is a worthy contribution to that effort, and will certainly help to bring this seminal and provocative text to a wider circle of readers.