Philosophical Perspectives on Democracy in the 21st Century

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Ann E. Cudd and Sally J. Scholz (eds.), Philosophical Perspectives on Democracy in the 21st Century, Springer, 2014, 246pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319023113.

Reviewed by James Gledhill, The University of Hong Kong


The focus of this volume is both narrower and broader than its title might suggest. Originating from the 2012 conference of the American Section of the International Association for Philosophy of Law and Social Philosophy (AMINTAPHIL), it is predominantly concerned with the current state of democracy in America. And while a number of the chapters take up core philosophical debates in democratic theory, the broad range of perspectives on offer also derive from law and political science, continuing the approach of the AMINTAPHIL book series on the philosophical foundations of law and justice, of which this is the fifth volume.

In their introduction, the editors reflect on how global movements such as Occupy and the Arab Spring illustrate the continued capacity of the ideals of democracy to inspire mass political action, as well as the new forms this takes with the aid of social media. At the same time, the polarization of American politics and debates over the influence of big money, epitomized by the controversy over the 2010 United States Supreme Court decision in Citizens United v. Federal Election Commission, show the pressing challenges to the vitality of democracy.

The volume as a whole does not quite deliver on this aspiration for a global perspective, although there are some notable exceptions. The Occupy movement receives no further attention, and the Arab Spring only two brief discussions, whereas the Citizens United ruling is the focus of two chapters. Assessed on its own terms, though, this volume succeeds in offering a stimulating array of reflections on perennial philosophical debates and contemporary political challenges while maintaining a high degree of thematic coherence. The sixteen chapters are divided into four parts: The Meaning of Democracy; The Current Polarization; Democracy, Capitalism, and the Influence of Big Money; and Democratic Decisions and the (Un)Informed Public. In the following I will focus on the themes that emerge from these four parts.

Two of the chapters on the meaning of democracy are concerned with the relationship between the general and the particular. In 'Democracy as a Social Myth', Richard De George employs Lévi-Strauss's idea of a social myth in order to argue for the conclusion that 'We should not expect all democracies to be like American democracy, nor expect that [democracy] can be justified in an ultimate rather than a presumptive sense' (53). The meaning of democracy derives from its relationship to other concepts and values, and we should not expect or desire that the demands people make for their voices to be heard will necessarily result in the development of a liberal model of democracy. Lévi-Strauss's idea of a social myth is not explored in detail, and the idea of a social imaginary might equally do the desired work without the negative connotations, for the overall message is one of circumspection in seeking to fix the meaning of democracy rather than outright skepticism. Nevertheless, in advocating greater attention to historical and cultural variation, and to popular discourse, De George offers a welcome warning against parochialism.

The issue with which Rex Martin deals in 'Rights and the American Constitution: The Issue of Judicial Review and Its Compatibility with Democracy' is a perennial topic of legal and political philosophy, but in brief compass Martin shows how placing the issue in historical and comparative perspective can yield fresh insights. Based on an historical overview of the democratization of American political institutions, Martin argues that majoritarian democracy, being based on respecting the interests of each and all, demands the priority of basic constitutional rights. The issue of the compatibility of judicial review with democracy is harder. While a successful justification can be given for judicial review at the level of ideal normative theory, a practical political justification is another matter. Pointing to the different ways in which judicial review has developed around the world, Martin suggests that the democratic credentials of the US Supreme Court would be improved if there were a practice of justices retiring at age seventy and of the court showing restraint when it comes to applying ambiguous phrases such as the 'equal protection' or 'due process', clauses of the Fourteenth Amendment.

In the other chapter in this section, 'Democracy: A Paradox of Rights?', Emily Gill mounts a critique of Corey Brettschneider's theory of value democracy, according to which a state is only fully democratic if it not only protects rights of free association, expression, and conscience, but also promotes the values of self-government that underlie these rights amongst civil society. While not disputing the goal of free and equal citizenship, Gill objects to the means that Brettschneider recommends, arguing that he places excessive faith in the state using its persuasive capacities responsibly and misidentifies the fundamental problem, which is not what organizations believe but how they act.

Part II turns to the challenges of democracy under conditions of political polarization. In 'The Problem of Democracy in the Context of Polarization', Imer Flores sets out a framework for understanding polarization and when it is threatening to democracy. The difficulty of reaching consensus should not lead us to settle for a majoritarian conception of democracy, he argues, for this will force a dichotomous choice between either ignoring or overcoming polarization. By facing polarization head on, it can be made a resource for democratic deliberation that is potentially productive rather than destructive of democracy.

Stephen Nathanson focuses on 'Political Polarization and the Markets vs. Government Debate'. His argument is that polarization is exacerbated by the lack of an adequate conceptual framework for understanding the spectrum of ways in which markets and government can be combined in systems of property ownership, production, and allocation that lie between the extremes of anarcho-capitalism and state socialism. Nathanson sets out a typology of political systems of a kind familiar in philosophical discussions, but which could be valuable in encouraging more sophisticated and fine-grained political debate. The most striking aspect of his analysis, however, is the way he points to the disjunction between American capitalist ideology and the reality of welfare state institutions. In short, Americans 'live in a welfare state but do not know what it is' (60).

Richard Barron Parker labels the 'Two Visions of Democracy' with which he is concerned 'Type A' and 'Type B' democracy. Type A is a Lockean vision of democracy as a voluntary political association of self-governing individuals based on the principle of political equality. Type B is a more Rousseauian vision of democracy as founded on a national community of which the individual is a constituent par. On Parker's view, this is based on a principle of social and economic equality rather than political equality. A distinction such as that drawn by De George in the essay discussed above between popular, political, and philosophical strands of discourse about democracy might have helped to clarify Parker's argument. While common cultural nationality might have been, and might remain, important for Type B democracy at the popular level, at the philosophical level it could be argued that there is no necessary connection. Social and economic equality has been advocated as a corollary of real political equality. This is far from abandoning self-government for good government and succumbing to the embrace of paternalism, as Parker suggests.

In 'Proportional Representation, the Single Transferable Vote, and Electoral Pragmatism', Richard Nunan argues that electoral systems play an import role in shaping and potentially overcoming political polarization. Placing the debate between first-past-the-post systems and proportional representation in a broad theoretical perspective, he argues that the vision of voters as narrowly self-interested, proposed by elite theorists of democracy like Joseph Schumpeter and Richard Posner, is plausible only when one assumes a single-member district plurality electoral system such as that of the United States. Moving to a proportional system, on the other hand, particularly the single transferable vote, has the potential to help realize J. S. Mill's vision of a deliberative representative democracy. Nunan's point about the formative role of electoral systems remains important, even if one might question his optimism regarding the possible benefits of their reform.

Of the chapters in Part III on Democracy, Capitalism, and the Influence of Big Money, Alistair Macleod's contribution, 'Democracy and Economic Inequality', offers the broadest perspective. Macleod provides a helpful overview of the different ways in which money can distort democracy. This includes strategies for restricting the franchise, strategies for the manipulation of electoral processes, and strategies for undermining the background conditions required for true democracy. When it comes to the last of these, Macleod focuses on how the structure of the electoral system can benefit economic elites not only through tolerance of gerrymandering, but also -- echoing Nunan's argument -- through acceptance of the first-past-the-post electoral system.

Two essays in this section focus on the work of John Rawls. In posing the question 'Is Justice Possible Under Welfare State Capitalism?' Steven Lee contributes to a growing literature on Rawls's rejection of welfare state capitalism in favor of property-owning democracy. Lee takes issue with Rawls's negative answer to his titular question. He argues that Rawls's criticisms target only contingent rather than necessary features of welfare state capitalism, such that the Rawlsian conception of justice as fairness might be achieved through reform of the welfare state. Furthermore, he claims that property-owning democracy is not a coherent or feasible alternative. The first point seems the less salient; Rawls's model of welfare state capitalism plays the role of an ideal type in his argument, after all. But the question of whether property-owning democracy represents a desirable and stable hybrid of capitalism and socialism is an important one.

Mark Navin makes original and stimulating use of Rawls's work in 'Rawls on Inequality, Social Segregation and Democracy'. He first reconstructs Rawls's distinction between the antisocial vice of envy and the non-vicious and potentially virtuous feeling of resentment that is an appropriate response to injustice. Navin then analyses Rawls's idea that the voluntary social segregation that occurs when citizens' energies are directed towards the private associations of civil society will reduce envy. His conclusion is that while this might be a desirable result at the level of ideal theory, it is problematic at the level of non-ideal theory as it will also inhibit the formation of justified resentment and reinforce complacency about inequality.

The remaining two essays in this section are focused on the issues raised by the 2010 Citizens United decision. F. Patrick Hubbard's conclusion is qualified. In 'Mass Democracy in a Postfactual Market Society: Citizens United and the Role of Corporate Political Speech', he suggests that the Supreme Court's ruling was not necessarily incorrect and that the impact of corporate political speech has been exaggerated. Moreover, other avenues are available for limiting the impact of money on politics.

Jonathan Schonsheck's argument, by contrast, is vehement, as its title makes clear: 'A Tsunami of Filthy Lucre: How the Decisions of the SCOTUS Imperil American Democracy'. For Schonsheck, the court's decision, based upon a 'primitive' originalist theory of constitutional interpretation, is the latest in a long line of decisions that have led to the replacement of democracy by a 'representative plutocracy'.

The final section provides empirical and theoretical perspectives on Democratic Decisions and the (Un)Informed Public. In 'Motivated Reasoning, Group Identification, and Representative Democracy', Kenneth Henley offers an overview of research in social psychology which suggests that reasoning in politics often takes the form of trying to justify prior beliefs rather than engage in real dialogue, and that this tendency is heighted by group identification. After surveying the positions of Rawls and Habermas, he concludes that there is a general tendency to 'naively rely upon reason to correct the defects caused by our emotion and our social conditioning' (222). One might question the extent to which such positions rest upon a naïve rationalist faith, however. Seeking to describe and develop our capacity to make public use of our reason might be important precisely because doing so is the exception rather than the rule, requiring favorable conditions that are easily undermined.

Russell Waltz considers similar issues, but with a focus on the role of 'Journalists as Purveyors of Partial Truths'. The ideal of deliberative democracy demands an informed citizenry, and this is threatened when journalists focus on personal narratives rather than placing events in a broader social, political and historical context, he argues. Illustrating this point with reference to two different ways in which the 2007 Virginia Tech shooting was covered in the media, this essay provides a useful basis for discussing issues of journalism and objectivity.

In 'Republics, Passions and Protests', Wade Robison takes up longstanding concerns about the contagious spread of civic passions and how they are affected by new technology that allows news and ideas to go viral in minutes. Questioning the skepticism of those such as Malcolm Gladwell, who argue that revolutions 'will not be tweeted', Robison argues that events like the Arab Spring show how social media has empowered citizens, often for good as well as ill.

In one of the standout chapters of the volume, Jason Brennan disputes the claim that epistocracy is incompatible with the liberal principle of legitimacy that is central to political liberalism. As the title of his chapter puts it, we can have 'Epistocracy Within Public Reason'. Epistocracy is the idea that experts should rule on the basis of their greater moral and social scientific knowledge. The liberal principle of legitimacy states that the coercive political power of the state must be justified in a way that all reasonable citizens can endorse as free and equal. Is epistocracy compatible with liberal legitimacy? According to the 'controversial expertise argument', reasonable people could reasonably disagree about what counts as expertise. Given such reasonable objections, epistocracy violates the liberal principle of legitimacy. However, Brennan disputes the inference from the fact that any concrete instantiation of epistocracy is controversial to the conclusion that epistocracy per se is unjustified. Rather, what is required is a good umpire, a democratic method for determining an authoritative standard of political competence, whether this takes the form of a referendum, the decision of an elected council, or a deliberative poll. In short, 'Democracies may authorize an epistocracy, provided they retain democratic control over the legal interpretation of political competence' (203).

On a weak reading of Brenann's argument, one might wonder whether what he has defended is really epistocracy. Political liberals are most plausibly interpreted as arguing against allocating fundamental political power to experts, not against the recognition of expertise in domains over which the people retain democratic control. But, building upon his prior work on the right to a competent electorate, a strong reading is suggested by Brennan's claim that if democracy is competent to establish a standard of political competence, then it would be consistent with the liberal principle of legitimacy to 'use that conception to decide who is allowed to vote'. Here, though, it might be argued that one could not 'democratically' disenfranchise some members of a democratic society. At the level of principle, to do so would be to undermine the equal status of all citizens when it comes to determining the ground rules of their association, and, furthermore, in practice it would remove a key safeguard for ensuring that it is the 'the people' collectively rather than some portion of them who retain control. Despite some ambiguity about the implications of its argument, though, Brennan's chapter stands out as a rigorous, self-contained and original contribution that merits further discussion.

These essays are uniformly thought provoking and well written. The chapters are short, averaging fewer than 15 pages, and while this does mean that they are easily digestible, they sometimes offer tantalizing tastes of arguments developed in more detail elsewhere, or make bold claims that are not substantiated as fully as one might expect. A number are more focused on surveying existing literature than developing new lines of argument. Overall, though, the volume as a whole is more than the sum of its parts. It will be welcomed by anyone looking for an overview of current debates at the intersection of philosophy, law and political science about the problems and prospects of democracy under the conditions of contemporary capitalism.