Philosophical Probings: Essays on von Wright's Later Work

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Frederick Stoutland (ed.), Philosophical Probings: Essays on von Wright's Later Work, Automatic Press, 2009, 208pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9788792130204.

Reviewed by Lou Goble, Willamette University



This volume presents twelve essays to honor the philosophical work and life of Georg H. von Wright, who died in June 2003. The first six, comprising “Part 1: Rationality, Goodness, and Action”, are revised versions of papers originally presented at a conference in May 2006 at Åbo Akademi University in memory of von Wright. These address several questions that were much on von Wright’s mind through the later part of his career, the period after about 1963 when Varieties of Goodness1 and Norm and Action2 were published. These include the nature of norms, the varieties of goodness, the compatibility of determinism and intentional action, practical reasoning and future contingents. Although these papers all pay homage to von Wright’s ideas, with the exception of the first they are more concerned with the problems in their own right than with explication or criticism of von Wright’s own views. The second part, “Part 2: Logic and Philosophy, Then and Now”, begins with a reprint of von Wright’s own essay, “Logic and Philosophy in the Twentieth Century”3, and then continues with six short discussions, solicited by the editor, concerning the place of logic in philosophy in the century ahead. The editor’s “Introduction” opens the volume. This is chiefly an intellectual biography of von Wright, which sets the stage for the philosophical discussions to follow by presenting von Wright as a person, a philosopher committed to the investigation of numerous, truly challenging questions through a long and distinguished career.

The first paper, “Von Wright on Normative Rationality” by Alberto Emiliani, raises the question with which von Wright wrestled until the end of his life: what, if anything, is the foundation of normative reasoning? Or: how is a deontic logic possible? (This from the man who is responsible for the modern study of deontic logic.) Deontic logic seems to be a logic of norms, but norms lack truth value and so seem incapable of standing in relations of consistency, entailment, etc. that are the proper domain of logic. Emiliani’s essay describes two ways in which von Wright tried to resolve this dilemma in Norm and Action. On one hand, deontic logic might be viewed not as a logic of prescriptive norms per se, but as a logic of descriptive norm-propositions, statements to the effect that certain norms exist. Those are amenable to standard logical analysis, but there does not seem to be anything distinctive about their logic. On the other hand, deontic logic might be viewed as the set of principles a rational norm-giver would follow in instituting a system of norms. From this perspective, the principles of deontic logic devolve from what it means to be a rational norm-giver. This was perhaps von Wright’s preferred position by the end of Norm and Action. He returned, however, to this question repeatedly in the years following the publication of his book, never reaching a solution that fully satisfied him. Emiliani’s paper is a revised version of his introduction to the Italian translation of Norm and Action. Its primary purpose is to articulate a key component of that book, not to question von Wright’s positions or even the direction of his inquiry. The chapter ends with a previously unpublished letter from von Wright to Emiliani.

David Wiggins, in “What is the Order among the Varieties of Goodness? A Question Posed by von Wright”, attempts to discover unity amongst the myriad uses of ‘good’ by applying a strategy (derived from Aristotle) of finding a focal sense and then showing how the others can be understood through their relations to it. Wiggins proposes that the focus be, in von Wright’s phrase, the good of a being, and he argues that many of the sorts of good von Wright has described can be seen as offshoots of this notion. The closer he looks, however, the less adequate this focus seems, and by the end of the essay one must say the strategy has failed. It is not clear what we have gained as a result of this musing. Perhaps we see more connections among sorts of good than we had seen before, and perhaps we see more sorts of good than von Wright himself considered, especially aesthetic goods.

Von Wright claimed,

Determinism is compatible with action in the sense that every change in the world which results from an action of an agent, i.e., is imputed to agency, might also have resulted from another change which was its causally sufficient condition.4

Frederick Stoutland, the volume’s editor, takes up and supports this view in “Von Wright’s Compatibilism”. He reconstructs von Wright’s compatibilism in something of a post-Sellarsian way, taking there to be two kinds of explanation of behavior, one in the ‘logical space of laws’, the other in the ‘logical space of reasons’. Determinism can apply only within the former; the idea of action and agency can apply only within the latter, which presupposes normative concepts that are excluded from the other. Since these ‘spaces’ are separate, the two explanations are compatible. Stoutland calls this compatibilism ‘Kantian’.

Martina Reuter’s “Kantianism and von Wright’s Compatibilism” is a direct response to parts of Stoutland’s paper. She objects that the picture he presents is not Kantian at all. Kant distinguished not two kinds of explanation, but two quite separate worlds, an empirical world of phenomena, governed by a natural necessity, and a noumenal world of freedom and morality, governed by a necessity of reason. Stoutland’s two explanations, since they are supposed to apply to the same behavior, must both apply instead solely to the empirical world. She suggests that Stoutland’s picture may have more affinities to Husserl’s phenomenological reformulation of transcendental philosophy.

Fidelity to Kant (or, we might add, to von Wright) aside, Reuter also rightly questions in what sense we could have two explanations of the same behavior (p. 86). Stoutland claims that this account does not violate Kim’s ‘principle of explanatory exclusion’ since the two explanations, because they belong to separate logical spaces, have different explananda. "Although we explain the same behavior, there is not … a single explanandum’ (p. 73). This sounds like a contradiction. Stoutland goes on to say, however: “because in giving an explanation of behavior we must explain it as described.” The two explanations, belonging to two logical spaces, must describe the behavior in two different ways. This makes it sound as if it is not behavior that is explained, but behavior under a description, whatever that is. It is presumably not an event or state of affairs in the world. If not, we have strayed rather far from the traditional questions of determinism, action, and compatibilism. (Cf. Reuter, p. 86.) Moreover, from Stoutland’s own examples, we do seem to have competing explanations — one in terms of neuroscientific laws and one in terms of actions and reasons — of behavior described in a single way, e.g., that a person’s arm moves (p. 75). It would seem more fruitful simply to reject Kim’s principle, and to accept disparate explanations of a single phenomenon when the explanations are of significantly different kinds, and so answer significantly different questions. This would, of course, call for a much closer look at what constitutes an adequate explanation of behavior than we see here. However that turns out, it would leave a very thin sense of compatibilism.

Krister Segerberg, in “Von Wright and the Logic of the Practical Syllogism”, offers some first steps toward a logic of practical reasoning, in which propositional premises may entail an action for a conclusion. This is set in a framework of modal logic, for the propositional expression of wants (intentions or desires) and beliefs (of the efficacy of an action in attaining a want), and propositional dynamic logic, for the representation of action and action’s results, together with temporal modalities. Since the conclusion of a practical syllogism does not always result even when the appropriate wants and beliefs hold, Segerberg likens practical inferences to developments in nonmonotonic reasoning, especially Reiter’s default logic. Unfortunately, the picture presented here is so sketchy and fragmentary that it is hard to make anything of it. We might wish for more.

In a sense, Dag Prawitz returns to the question of determinism in his paper “Logical Determination and the Principle of Bivalence”, which takes up the question of future contingents raised by Aristotle with his notorious Sea-Battle Argument. In line with von Wright’s own discussion of this topic,5 Prawitz argues that defeating the logical argument for determinism and accommodating future contingents does not require abandoning the principle of bivalence or the law of the excluded middle for future-tensed propositions. Whereas von Wright challenged the determinist’s argument by distinguishing two sorts of necessity, Prawitz considers a single sense of necessity to suffice, so long as it is sufficiently temporalized. He briefly sketches how such a temporal necessity could be formally modelled; this presupposes that among the many possible histories from a moment there is one determinate history that is the actual history of the world (p. 129). Prawitz also contrasts his temporalized ‘factual’ necessity with epistemic necessity. Though the account here is only sketched, this might be the most successful piece in the collection.

Part 2 of this volume opens with von Wright’s own essay, “Logic and Philosophy in the Twentieth Century”. This presents a fairly standard account of the development of modern logic and its influence on philosophy. The essay describes the three schools of logicism, intuitionism and formalism; concerns with the foundations of mathematics, then the foundations of the empirical sciences, and then conceptual analysis generally; and the linguistic turn that is characteristic of what is considered analytic philosophy today. Von Wright sees much of that development as a ‘Golden Age of Logic’. He ends the essay, however, on a pessimistic note for the future, which he sees will be a time when logic no longer plays a significant role in philosophy but will instead have found its home in other fields, mathematics, computer science, linguistics or cognitive science. That forecast, that pessimism, is the focus of the remaining papers in the collection, as several notable philosopher-logicians reflect on the future of their fields.

Nuel Belnap, in his very short “A note on von Wright’s Lecture on Logic and Philosophy in the Twentieth Century”, seems to share von Wright’s pessimism, at least about the future of logic in philosophy. By contrast, Johan van Benthem, in his “Logic and Philosophy in the Century that Was”, and Sven Ove Hansson, in “The Demise of Modern Logic?”, are both more optimistic. They see a robust future for logic and for philosophy that draws on new developments in logic. Although she is less confident than von Wright of the benefits of formal logic in philosophy in the twentieth century, Eva Picardi (“The Place of Logic in Philosophy”) shares the optimism of van Benthem and Hansson that logic will continue to play a vital role within philosophy. She points especially to current work in the philosophy of mathematics to show that the river that sprang from the well of Frege and others still flows strong. On the other hand, Sören Stenlund, in "Von Wright on the Future of Logic and Philosophy", disputes von Wright’s picture of logic in philosophy in the twentieth century as a golden or heroic age. Instead, he regards the hegemony of Gödelian first-order logic as a stultifying dogma under which philosophy has seen more decline than glory. Timothy Williamson (“Logic and Philosophy in the Twenty-First Century”) also finds problems with the paradigm of classical first-order logic, though less for what it suppresses than what it conceals. Logic, he contends, cannot be considered a neutral arbiter between theories. Hence, it will be contentious, and where there is contention there will be a place for logic within philosophy.

Predictions about the future of philosophy, or logic, seem pointless. They are too likely merely to reflect the interests of the predictor. More interesting in these discussions are the different views about what the work of logic is, or should be, and what the work of philosophy is, or should be, and what the interplay between the two is, or should be. Von Wright’s own pessimism is difficult to evaluate. He seems to think that logic will not figure importantly in philosophy in the twenty-first century because it will have become science instead. Perhaps so, but one might think scientific logic can still be used to advantage within philosophy. That much is van Benthem’s and Hansson’s point. Nevertheless, while it might be so used, that is not to say that it will be. Von Wright sees philosophy now turning away from confidence in the scientific (p. 157). On the other hand, according to the editor’s Introduction, in his later years von Wright himself had come to distrust the ‘scientific rationality’ of the twentieth century (p. 12). If so, we might wonder at the pessimistic tone of his remarks. He might have taken philosophy’s turn away from logic as liberating, much as Stenlund seems to advocate.

All in all, this volume is an apt memorial to a distinguished philosopher, though perhaps the papers themselves are not so very memorable. Von Wright would surely have appreciated the discussions, and anyone interested in von Wright’s work should be interested in seeing how others approach some of the questions with which he was so much concerned. That is so even if these accounts do not ultimately add much illumination to their topics.

1 G. H. von Wright, Varieties of Goodness, (Routledge and Kegan Paul), 1963.

2 G. H. von Wright, Norm and Action: A Logical Inquiry, (Routledge and Kegan Paul), 1963.

3 Originally presented at the 9th Congress of Logic, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science in Uppsala in 1991, and published in Logic, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science, IX, D. Prawitz, B. Skyrms, and D. Westerståhl (eds.), (Elsevier), 1994, pp. 9-25.

4 From the text, p. 62, including the emphasis, taken from G. H. von Wright, Causality and Determinism, (Columbia University Press), 1974, p. 133.

5 G. H. von Wright, “Time, Truth, and Necessity” in Intention and Intentionality, C. Diamond and J. Teichman (eds.), (Cornell University Press), 1979, pp. 237-250.