Philosophical Provocations: 55 Short Essays

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Colin McGinn, Philosophical Provocations: 55 Short Essays, MIT Press, 2017, 317pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036191.

Reviewed by Simon Blackburn, University of Cambridge


As should be expected, Colin McGinn's collection of essays displays many virtues. It is bold, original, intelligent, and the product of many years of deep acquaintance with a wide range of philosophical problems and their recent treatments. It is beautifully clear, and a good advertisement for the short, self-contained, jargon-free essay. It is also, as the title promises, provocative, both in the bland sense of provoking thought, which anyone writing as a philosopher would hope to do, and in the spicier sense of being unafraid of treading on many peoples' toes, or even, perhaps, hoping to do so. At any rate, its author emerges as a large-scale contrarian, impatiently opposed to many movements in contemporary philosophical thought, and quite happy to suppose that it does not take much to show that they are largely wrong-headed. Many of the essays are self-standing pieces of excellent, thought-provoking philosophy (those on modality and color being especially noteworthy). Others are more casual, more like jeux d'esprit.

The fifty-five essays are presented under seven headings: Mind (12 essays), Language (8), Knowledge (8), Metaphysics (11), Biology (5), Ethics (8), and Religion (3). The longest is 'Knowing and Necessity' at 20 pages, and the shortest is 'Physical Noncognitivism' at one and a half pages.

When he kicked a stone to refute Berkeley, Dr. Johnson saw himself as a robust common-sense realist rebutting a wholly fantastical idealism. McGinn is something of a Johnsonian: he too has strong views about things being real. His realities include the conscious mind, the unconscious mind, the private world, the noumenal world as well as the phenomenal world, real properties and causal relations, universals, and facts themselves, including moral facts. He knows, of course, that such doctrines involve mysteries, but he is hospitable to mysteries: he is perhaps best known for his 'mysterian' philosophy of mind, holding that there is indeed a 'hard problem' of consciousness but it is likely to be a problem that we are cognitively unequipped to resolve. He has little sympathy with the mid-twentieth century optimism of Wittgenstein, Strawson, Austin, Ryle, Sellars or Quine, dismissing the 'hard problem' as a mirage. He holds instead that any mind-brain identity theory, or any functionalism, or indeed any view according priority to what is public, succumbs to the well-known assaults of Nagel, Jackson, Kripke, Putnam, Chalmers, and Block. He is constitutionally a protector of hard problems, and it is their would-be solvers that he particularly hopes to provoke.

McGinn also holds that as well as the conscious mind there is a domain of unconscious mental states. Memories, for instance, persist through time as unconscious mental states, and not just as modifications of the brain that determine what, on occasion, we can bring to consciousness. Again, though, he agrees that we have 'no adequate concept of unconscious mental states'. Causal necessity, as well, is 'as real as anything in nature,' but here too we are inevitably totally baffled as to how it works: realistic mysterianism is once more the answer. This is the view that we know that there is something whose nature we shall never know, although McGinn remains relatively silent about the good that this piece of knowledge is supposed to do for us. Not for McGinn the thought that nothing will do as well as something about which nothing can be said, nor even Hume's view that if we deal in such things 't'will be of little consequence to the world'.

McGinn poses for himself the problem that his view of philosophy leaves him. He holds both that philosophy is exhausted by conceptual analysis, and that there are problems of philosophy that might be forever insoluble by us. I am much readier to agree that there are philosophical problems insoluble by conceptual analysis, as that is usually understood, than that there are problems insoluble by philosophy taken more generously. Moore's impasse when faced with ethics is enough of a warning, compared with the tradition of Hume and Smith, which worked via an understanding of our psychologies and their genealogy rather than narrow conceptual analysis.

McGinn's own solution, presented in the chapter 'Analysis and Mystery', is that the right concepts may be unavailable to us. Were a species to form the right concepts, it would not have our problems, but that species is not us, either as we are, or even as we might become. Both the families of concepts that might be innate to us, and the family arising from the way we think about empirical experience, fail to contain the keys that turn the locks. This is itself, of course, a possibility described de dicto rather than de re -- we can say that 'there might be concepts which would provide solutions' but we can never say of any concept that it provides a solution, since we can have no way of framing such a concept to ourselves. We cannot even know in which direction to look for coming nearer to such concepts; not only are there are no strategies for unlocking philosophical mysteries, in the way there are for unlocking scientific mysteries, there are not even strategies for getting any closer to doing so.

Bertrand Russell wrote that his grandmother despised his interest in metaphysics, telling him that the whole subject could be summed up in the saying: "What is mind? No matter; what is matter? Never mind." Russell added 'on the fifteenth or sixteenth repetition of this remark it ceased to amuse me' and one might sympathise, but McGinn follows Grannie. She was right about the central concepts of metaphysics: mind, body, causation, time, freedom, and in fact reality in general. Grannie however was ridiculing poor Bertie's interest in the subject, and I do not think McGinn intends to do that. He has, after all, pursued a long and distinguished career in it. Nevertheless, the worry persists that perhaps Grannie was right, and the best policy is not to think about these things at all.

Although this depressing view of the possibilities for philosophy forms a central theme in the book, it by no means exhausts its contents. Once McGinn leaves heavy-duty metaphysics, he becomes distinctly more sprightly, dancing elegantly around issues in the philosophy of biology, ethics, and religion.

In the section on biology, McGinn is at his best in an essay ('The Language of Evolution') pointing out the pitfalls in Darwin's analogy between the kind of selection that breeders of animals or plants go in for, and anything that happens in nature. He suggests that instead of natural selection Darwin should have contented himself with saying that while human beings purposely select, animals and plants reproductively compete, with some more successful at generating heirs than others. There is nothing but metaphor involved in reifying 'nature' as an intentional agent. I agree that this is a useful point to make. I am not so clear how it fits with another essay ('Selfish Genes and Moral Parasites'). In this essay McGinn takes very seriously Richard Dawkins's problem of how to reconcile apparent human altruism with our selfish genes, and expounds an answer drawing on the example of the cuckoo parasitizing prey species, such as the reed warbler. The reed warbler is not being altruistic as it raises a cuckoo chick. It has been hoodwinked. Similarly, McGinn thinks, we are manipulative and manipulated into such altruism as we manage. We parasitize each other without realizing it, or rather our genes do: 'the gene that manipulates the mind-brain of others the best is the one that makes the target enjoy what is in fact manipulation'. I am afraid I am myself no happier with the idea of genes manipulating people than I am with nature selecting survivors: the underlying literal truth seems to be, roughly, that we reinforce any altruistic tendencies we find in each other, which is no doubt true, but not very shocking. McGinn goes on to talk of the central role of language in manipulation, but he can scarcely credit those manipulative genes with linguistic powers. But then I do not take Dawkins's problem seriously either, and I don't think the kinds of symbiotic relationships that are found through biology are well conceptualized either in terms of selfishness or of manipulation.

'God and the Devil' is the penultimate, and second shortest, essay in the collection. It suggests the possibility that God and the Devil are in fact identical, rather like Dr. Jekyll and Mr. Hyde. To the obvious objection that the religious conception of God involves His being perfectly good, which would not be the case if He is identical with the Devil, McGinn breezily replies that 'this argument begs the question against the identity claim, since that is precisely what we should abandon if we accept identity'. Here, as elsewhere, one may be left spluttering that more needs to be said: if somebody suffers from the delusion that Paris is the same city as London, it scarcely begs the question to point out that Paris is in France and London is not, although 'that is precisely what we should abandon if we accept identity'. I do not think that McGinn would be much troubled by this riposte: perhaps he is satisfied to have provoked the splutter. This essay leads to the final flourish, in which the coat that McGinn is trailing gets even longer as he recommends and defends a religion not of love, but of hate. 'You must hate everyone (with the possible exception of yourself, but even then) . . . '. Wisely, he does not dwell on the results we might expect if his religion of hate were followed, engendering more hate in the world than we already have. I try not to splutter again when I suggest that we already have enough.

Obviously there are many other essays than the ones I have been able to mention, and many of them repay serious attention. I do not think the collection could be recommended to students without a fair amount of assistance, since quite often positions are simply indicated by the names of people who hold them (Quine, Wittgenstein, Putnam, and so on) without further elaboration. But they could certainly form a spicy addition to courses that are already up and running. They would serve as good fuel for people coming new to philosophy, and it is no bad thing to have someone else to get one's students to splutter.