Philosophy and Its History: Aims and Methods in the Study of Early Modern Philosophy

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Mogens Lærke, Justin E. H. Smith, and Eric Schliesser (eds.), Philosophy and Its History: Aims and Methods in the Study of Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 362pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199857166.

Reviewed by Gary Hatfield, University of Pennsylvania


The history of philosophy became a recognized subdiscipline of philosophy in the eighteenth century. The first half of the twentieth century saw excellent historically sensitive work in history of philosophy, by Edwin A. Burtt, N. K. Smith, Arthur O. Lovejoy, S. V. Keeling, and many others. Following a nadir in, at least, the prominence of historical work in the collective philosophical consciousness during the 1960s in the United States (and perhaps one or two preceding decades in England), interest increased in the history of philosophy and its historiography. This interest was expressed in conferences, edited volumes, and individual works in the history of philosophy, led by Michael Ayers, Maurice Mandelbaum, Richard Popkin, Jerome Schneewind, Margaret Wilson, and John Yolton, among others.

The present volume builds on the resurgence of history of philosophy in the past forty years to take stock of the aims and methods of the history of early modern philosophy. In the Introduction, the editors distinguish problem-oriented "appropriationist" history of philosophy -- which scrutinizes past texts for hints or ready-made arguments to use in resolving present-day philosophical problems -- from avowedly antiquarian contextualist history of philosophy, which investigates past texts for their own sake without regard to philosophy today. They portray the appropriationists as holding that

it is simply not philosophically relevant whether the rational reconstructions of past philosophers one develops correspond to the intentions of that philosopher, as long as these reconstructions yield conceptual results and address contemporary concerns in an interesting way. (2)

The point is to peruse past texts looking for "possible solutions . . . to perennial problems of philosophy" (2). By contrast, the editors portray contextualists as hewing to a principle proposed by the intellectual historian Quentin Skinner, according to which (quoting Skinner) "[n]o agent can eventually be said to have meant or done something which he could never be brought to accept as a correct description of what he had meant or done" (2). Contextualists must eschew the use of present-day concepts and distinctions in their discussions of past philosophers, adopting what is elsewhere in the book termed an "unapologetic antiquarianism" (10).

This puts historians of philosophy in a bind. They must choose "between either being untrue to the aims and intentions of the historical figures or abandoning the project of philosophy altogether in order to engage in social and cultural history, paleography, or the minute forensic work of the archival researcher" (2). A third option is familiar from Continental philosophy. It takes philosophy to be "a fundamentally historical process" in which present-day philosophers put themselves in "dialectical" relation with past philosophy, not aiming to reconstruct past philosophers historically but to include them in a narrative structure that sensibly leads to the point of view of the present-day philosopher (3). This position differs from appropriationism in taking philosophy to be a historical process and from contextualism (as defined by the editors) in not being concerned to interpret past philosophers solely in the terms of the past.

The volume aims to "go beyond the standard ways of doing history of philosophy" (5) that the editors have sketched by creating an "inclusive discussion" involving a "range of different methodological approaches" (4). It includes an international array of authors (now or previously living in Denmark, France, the Netherlands, Germany, Canada, and the U.S.), varying in career stage.

In considering the volume's fourteen chapters, let us first note how various authors relate to the allegedly "standard" dichotomy between problem-oriented appropriationism and unapologetic antiquarianism. The first two chapters, by two volume editors (Mogens Lærke and Justin Smith), accept the dichotomy by endorsing antiquarianism and seeking to improve on Skinner's version (for instance, by endorsing work that widens context to include non-textual artefacts, such as the telescope or microscope). A third chapter (by Joanne Waugh and Roger Ariew) accepts the dichotomy by mounting an attack on problem-oriented philosophia perennis, designed to show the local, historical contingency of philosophical problems. The rest of the chapters eschew the dichotomy or problematize it. Some advocate a type of appropriationism that engages in contextual study while nonetheless using history to enrich contemporary philosophy (Michael Della Rocca, Eric Schliesser, Mary Domski). The remaining seven chapters either reject the disjunctive implications of the dichotomy (Koen Vermeir, Ursula Goldenbaum, Leo Catana) or ignore the dichotomy while offering their own insights on engaging the history of early modern philosophy (Julie Klein, Delphine Kolesnik-Antoine, Alan Nelson, Yitzhak Melamed). The fourteen chapters do not offer a shared vision of the history of philosophy, its methodology, or even its current tendencies, and that's a good thing. Moreover, they don't all accept Skinner's dictum or antiquarianism as defining the contextualism of recent decades, and that's a good thing, too.

Lærke's chapter seeks to improve on Skinner's methodological dictum that past philosophers should be ascribed only positions that they could formulate in their own terms and would accept. He expands the range of ascribable positions to include all the historically actual (i.e., actually articulated) positions internal to the perspectives of the time, including interpretations that conflict with the target philosopher's self-understanding (21). This "actualism" aims to prevent speculative extensions of past positions in ways that weren't articulated at the time. I find a difficulty here, when thinking of interpreting an author's own words, in knowing whether these strictures allow positions to be ascribed to the author that no one at the time noticed or understood, perhaps because of their boldness or novelty. Lærke also suggests an interpretive focus on an author's "interventions" in past controversies. This is often good advice, but not all early modern philosophy was primarily polemical; some was avowedly constructive and created new points for subsequent debate.

We can follow "actualism" as it plays out in two other chapters. Catana rejects the notion that problems are eternal but accepts the philosophical problem as a good unit of analysis in the history of philosophy (118). These problems, he advises, should be understood and interpreted through "historical and philological contextualization" (133). He is, however, skeptical of attempts to treat much of early modern philosophy as systematic. His reason is that "the historiographical concept of a system of philosophy is an anachronistic invention of the eighteenth century" (owing to Johann Jacob Brucker) (129). Accordingly, he restricts the system concept to philosophies of the seventeenth to nineteenth centuries, an apparent application of the actualist filter, which treats the eighteenth century as being close enough in perspective to the seventeenth to make "system" legitimately descriptive. The notion is not to be applied prior to the seventeenth century, which means that there were no systems of philosophy put forward by the likes of Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, or Ockham.

Nelson, by contrast, proposes that the notion of philosophical system is widely applicable and provides an analytical tool for historians of philosophy. He contrasts systematic interpretation with those contextualist approaches that avoid reference to authors' intentions. In viewing a philosopher as a system builder, an intention toward systematic coherence is imputed. Similarly, his approach is in tension with rational reconstruction, which treats arguments in isolation from their dependence on system (237). More generally, obviating the actualist filter, he lists "Plato, Aquinas, Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Kant, etc." as systematic philosophers. The notion of system becomes an interpretive and normative tool for Nelson. He suggests that the "great" philosophers really were great, in part because they were authors of original systems. Nelson also notes problems for systematic interpretation, such as a tendency to see systems as responding to pre-given problems; in his view, what counts as a philosophical problem arises from within a system (247-48).

Other especially interesting contributions to the historiography of early modern philosophy are offered by Klein, Kolesnik-Antoine, and Melamed. Klein uses Spinoza to articulate a notion of philosophical readers and the activity of philosophical reading. Spinoza himself theorizes the reader as someone in need of "intellectual purification and healing, and affective change in order to cultivate the habits of reason and true judgment" (154). She sees Spinoza as seeking to cultivate philosophical readers. In analyzing philosophical readers more generally, she notes that "philosophical reading, and more generally, philosophical thinking, is both receptive and productive" (138). For the historian of philosophy, the receptive part includes attention to "the material history of the text: its language, its audience, its context" (155). At the same time, we ourselves are "historically situated" and cannot hope to "meet texts empty-handed" (157, 156). We bring the knowledge, skills, and interests of a contemporary philosopher to the text. In Klein's hands, this acknowledgement does not lead to the skeptically historicist view that past texts are ultimately inaccessible so that all that remains for us is anachronism (157). It does lead to the positive charge that we should be reflective about the master narratives we accept and the ways in which our own intellectual tendencies interact with our reading.

Kolesnik-Antoine considers how philosophers become grouped into families by examining the apparently counter-intuitive grouping of Malebranche and Locke as descendants of Descartes. She provides a fascinating survey of nineteenth-century classifications of Descartes and subsequent philosophers, focusing on the Cousinian school (esp. Jean-Phillipe Damiron) and the 1839 Essay Competition on the history of Cartesianism, won jointly by Francisque Bouillier and Jean Baptiste Bordas-Demoulin. Various discussions of Descartes and his aftermath grouped Locke with Malebranche, for different and complex reasons. Incidentally, she provides evidence that early nineteenth-century French groupings of Malebranche with Locke were abetted by attention to Dugald Stewart's work. Stewart was, we may note, a follower of Thomas Reid, who grouped Descartes, Malebranche, and Locke together as having created the problem of the external world by mutually adopting the theory of ideas.

Melamed evaluates the practice of giving "charitable" interpretations of past philosophers so that they "got it right" by contemporary standards (265). Focusing on Spinoza, he examines recent "charitable" interpretations according to which Spinoza spawned the early "Radical Enlightenment" (265) by advocating the separation of church and state, religious toleration, racial and sexual equality, sexual emancipation, a universal right to knowledge, and democracy as the best form of government. Melamed argues that Spinoza didn't hold the views attributed to him, or, in the case of democracy, offered only a lukewarm endorsement. Turning the tables on charitable interpretation, he contends that Spinoza should be philosophically interesting for us today precisely because he offers strong arguments for views different from our own. Melamed endorses approaching past philosophers with the same critical attitude we apply to our contemporaries, while all the same allowing those philosophers to speak in their own voices, eschewing the tendency to make them more like us in order to make them seem better or more interesting. As he puts it, "precise historical reconstruction is a major prerequisite for using past philosophers in the most profitable manner philosophically" (274) (echoing a historiographical theme of recent decades).

Schmaltz and Domski consider historical and present-day relations between philosophy and science. Schmaltz considers the relation between history of philosophy and history of science, noting that although history of science has grown away from philosophy of science, it remains relevant for history of philosophy. He advocates not a "marriage" of the two, nor an absorption of the history of early modern science into the history of early modern philosophy, but a cooperative relation. Domski offers a new appropriationism that relies on contextualist methods. Like Melamed, she contends that the value in past philosophy can be its differences from contemporary philosophy (279). Meta-reflection on these differences offers new perspectives on contemporary theories, a point that she illustrates by considering contemporary structural realism in relation to earlier structuralist tendencies in the works of Descartes and Newton.

The volume thus contains a good number of interesting and thoughtful chapters, which should enliven the ongoing discussions about the relations between work in the history of philosophy and in non-historical contemporary philosophy. The moral of these chapters: contextualism need not be antiquarian, and rigorous philosophical assessments of past texts need not be ahistorical.

There is an aspect of how the editors' Introduction, and a few chapters, place the efforts contained in this volume in relation to previous discussions of method and historiography. The Introduction twice contrasts the situation "thirty years ago" with a "recent . . . growing interest in questions of methodology in the history of philosophy" (4). This makes it seem as if the volume is part of a new departure, a new interest in method and historiography.

In fact, well before the year 1983 (thirty years before the volume's publication date), there was already an upswing in interest in the history of philosophy and its historiography. In 1970, Ayers noted an uptick in interest in philosophy's past. In 1977, the American Philosophical Association held a Symposium on Philosophy and Historiography, in which Mandelbaum discussed the problem of delimiting the scope of the history of philosophy because of the interconnection of past thought and intellectual practices, emphasized the importance of context, examined internal and external history, and distinguished studies that focus on only those aspects of past texts that are of contemporary interest from genuine history of philosophy (a criticism of what is called in the present volume "appropriationism" or problem-oriented history). In 1982-83, a series of lectures on Philosophy in History was held at The Johns Hopkins University, yielding a volume of the same title in 1984, edited by Richard Rorty, Schneewind, and Skinner -- the first in a new series on Ideas in Context published by the Cambridge University Press. The editors' Introduction to that volume offers nuanced discussion (pace Catana) of the relations between and the very possibility of purely antiquarian contextualist and wholly ahistorical problem-oriented treatments of past philosophy. (Schmaltz's chapter responds to several essays in this volume.) In 1982, Amélie Rorty asked authors to contribute to a volume of Essays on Descartes' Meditations (Berkeley, 1986), encouraging them to focus on the meditational structure of the work, a structure that drew on the historical practice of spiritual exercises. In 1983, A. J. Holland organized a conference on Philosophy and Its History at Lancaster, yielding Philosophy, Its History and Historiography (Dordrecht, 1985). One could continue. (Of the edited volumes and monographs from the 1980s and after that might be cited, only the Rorty et al. collection and a volume by Tom Sorell and G. A. J. Rogers, Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy, Oxford, 2005, garner repeated notice in the present volume.)

I am reminded of a remark by Yves Charles Zarka from the Sorell and Rogers collection. He expresses reservations about the value of methodological reflection in general and on the historiography of philosophy (at the start of an essay of such reflections). Among the reasons for his skepticism is this one:

[someone] will think he has brought about a revolution in the field by passing from a study of great texts by great philosophers to the consideration of a much bigger number of lesser philosophers, and thence to the consideration of the socio-political context in which a philosophical thought emerged. He will think this without realizing that he is repeating things which have been said again and again for decades. (p. 147)

The historical naiveté of the editorial Introduction does not diminish the considerable contributions made by those chapters that transcend the now outdated dichotomy between appropriationist and antiquarian history of philosophy to offer fresh methodological and historiographical perspectives.