Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual: Bergson and the Time of Life

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Ansell-Pearson, Keith, Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual: Bergson and the Time of Life, Routledge, 2002, 256pp, $25.95 (pbk.), ISBN 0-415-23728-9.

Reviewed by Daniel W. Smith, Purdue University


This book is the third in a trilogy of studies by Ansell-Pearson that began with Viroid Life: Perspectives on Nietzsche and the Transhuman (1997) and was continued in Germinal Life: The Difference and Repetition of Deleuze (1999). Though each book is ostensibly devoted to a separate figure—Nietzsche, Deleuze, and now Bergson—their titles indicate the common theme that unites them: the search for what Ansell-Pearson calls a “biophilosophy,” or a philosophy of Life, which is exemplified, in different ways, in each of these figures (Bergson’s élan vital, Nietzsche’s will to power, Deleuze’s virtuality). Such a biophilosophy implies the exploration of the “inhuman” or “supra-human” dimensions of experience, which in turn implies a conception of a virtual reality “beyond the human condition” (3), a Bergsonian phrase from Creative Evolution that Ansell-Pearson frequently cites. This “beyond” has little to do with cyberspace and information technology, where the concept of the virtual has gained a wide currency. Rather, it concerns two fundamental questions—being and time, ontology and temporality—and the attempt to redefine both these philosophical domains in terms of the modal concept of virtuality. Although being and time are recognizably Heideggerian themes (which no doubt attests to Heidegger’s enduring influence in contemporary thought), Heidegger does not figure prominently in the book, and indeed Ansell-Pearson takes these themes in decidedly non-Heideggerian directions.

Of the three books in Ansell-Pearson’s trilogy, Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual is the best, in my opinion, if only because it demonstrates a deepening mastery of the material and provides a clear presentation of Ansell-Pearson’s project. If Viroid Life marked a transition from Ansell-Pearson’s earlier work on Nietzsche, Germinal Life can be seen to have marked a transition to the present focus on Bergson and Deleuze. Although ostensibly a study of Bergson, Ansell-Pearson’s reading is strongly informed by Deleuze’s work, notably the latter’s 1966 book Bergsonism and his 1956 article on “Bergson’s Conception of Difference.” The current revival of interest in Bergson is at least partly due to Deleuze’s work. In his lifetime, Bergson was one of the most famous and widely read philosophers in the world, but his influence quickly waned, even in France, to the point that Deleuze would later note that “there are people these days who laugh at me simply for having written about Bergson at all.” Lévi-Strauss perhaps summarized the prevailing opinion in the 1950s when he quipped that Bergson had reduced everything to a state of mush in order to bring out its inherent ineffability. What the young Deleuze found in Bergson, however, was a philosopher who, while developing his own concepts of duration, memory, and the élan vital, had at the same time formulated rigorous conceptions of “difference,” “virtuality,” and “multiplicity.” It is these latter concepts that Deleuze himself would take up and develop in these early writings in a highly original manner, leading up to their full formulation in Deleuze’s most significant work, Difference and Repetition (1968).

The contemporary reception of Deleuze’s own Bergsonism in turn has tended to be linked with two interrelated areas of contemporary scientific research. The first is complexity theory (theories of self-organization, dynamic systems theory, etc.), which deals with irreversible time sequences in physics and elsewhere. Writers such as Ilya Prigogine and Isabelle Stengers have seen Bergson’s dynamic philosophy of change as a precursor to developments in “chaos” theory. The second is evolutionary biology, which deals with the question of “the time of life” (to use Ansell-Pearson’s subtitle), that is, the fact that Life itself entails a continual creation of unpredictable novelty (genetic differentiation). In Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual, Ansell-Pearson focuses primarily on the links between Bergson/Deleuze and biology, leaving it to others (such as Manuel Delanda) to explore the links with complexity theory (2). Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual can thus be seen as a kind of commentary on Deleuze’s Bergsonism, using evolutionary biology as a test case, and it is no doubt best read with the texts of Bergsonism and Difference and Repetition close at hand.

The book comprises seven essays, each of which focuses of a specific topic of Deleuze’s Bergsonism, though all are interrelated and cross-referenced. Along the way, we are provided with succinct analyses and critiques of several twentieth-century thinkers—such as Bertrand Russell, Karl Popper, Daniel Dennett, Alain Badiou, and Gaston Bachelard—who have, in various ways, touched on themes developed in the study. Ansell-Pearson also includes discussion of Bergson’s relation to various figures in the history of philosophy such as Parmenides, Plotinus, and Kant. The book is a rich mine of material, with veins leading in many directions. As the title indicates, however, Ansell-Pearson’s ambitious work can be seen to be organized around two primary themes: (1) the question of time, and the thesis that the future must be seen as the fundamental dimension of time, as the condition of the new (“The Time of Life”); (2) the formulation of a modal concept of virtuality that can account for the status of the new (“Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual”).


1. ‘Novelty’ and the primacy of the future. It is the third essay, “Duration and Evolution,” that addresses most directly what is perhaps the fundamental problematic of the book, namely, the issue of novelty. “Whether we are thinking of the unrolling of our inner lives or that of the universe as an open whole,” writes Ansell-Pearson, “we are dealing with ‘the continuous creation of unforeseeable novelty’” (77). But how is this production or creation of the new to be thought? The question seems to lead to a kind of antinomy. On the one hand, “determinism” suggests that the future is completely determined by the past, that we could predict the future with certainty if we had complete knowledge of present conditions (Laplace’s demon). In this view, the future is a kind of illusion that is, in principle at least, reducible to the past. On the other hand, if the future cannot simply be read off the past, then, as philosophers such as Bachelard and Badiou have argued, it seems that the new must necessarily be conceived of as a “break” or “interruption” in continuity—otherwise it would not be truly new. “The new is, almost by definition, that which exceeds prior conditions and which cannot be explained in terms of them” (71). But as Deleuze has noted in a different context, such an argument simply reintroduces the old notion of transcendence in a new form: in this modern formulation, “one seeks to rediscover a transcen-dence within the heart of immanence itself, as a breach or interruption of its field.” As Ansell-Pearson puts it, “to talk of the production of the new in terms of an interruption or founding break is to render it mysterious and almost inexplicable” (71).

This antinomy has often been resolved by distinguishing between “objective” and “subjective” time. In our subjective experience, the “arrow of time” seems to move inexorably from the past to the future, and this experience can be given a rigorous phenomenological description (Husserl’s Phenomenology of Time Consciousness). But the objective time for which science provides an explanatory model is a “reversible” time. This does not mean that the arrow of time flows backwards; it simply means that classical and relativistic physics express laws (e.g., of a body in motion) that remain invariant even if the temporal sequence is reversed. In the equations of classical physics, time is simply a parameter that remains unaffected by the transformations and processes it describes. What was ontologically primary in science was invariance under time-reversal. Recently, however, this classical view has come under increasing criticism (Ilya Prigogine is no doubt one of its most vocal critics). Thermodynamics had already introduced time-asymmetric processes into physics (the move toward thermal equilibrium); more recently, the development of non-linear branches of classical physics and the study of thermodynamic states “far-from-equilibrium” have introduced increasingly complex temporal models into physics. From this viewpoint, far from being a subjective illusion, the future is taken to be (both physically and ontologically) the fundamental dimension of time itself.

Ansell-Pearson’s argument in Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual is that this antinomy can be resolved only if the new (the future) is conceived of in Bergsonian terms as “duration” (durée) or “creative evolution” (élan vital), although to a certain degree Ansell-Pearson reinterprets both these notions. If time-asymmetry is still controversial in physics, it is less so in the “modern synthesis” in biology, which accounts for the production of the new in evolutionary terms. Bergson wrote Creative Evolution long before that synthesis occurred, but with his notion of the élan vital, he was striving for a philosophical conceptualization of the new that could be derived from the phenomenon of “Life” itself. Earlier, in Time and Free Will, Bergson had attempted to do the same with the concept of durée. Ansell-Pearson marshals these Bergsonian concepts in an effort to rethink this primacy of the future, extracting the concept of the élan vital from its matrix of “vitalism” (at least as understood as a mysterious “life-force”; Deleuze preferred to maintain the concept of vitalism in a renewed form), and extracting the concept of durée from its matrix of psychologism.

On this score, essay seven (subtitled “From Psychology to an Ontology of the Virtual”), charts out a reconfiguration that was already taking place in Bergson, but which Ansell-Pearson attempts to push to its limit: the move from psychology to ontology. In this sense, the first and last essays of the book operate as veritable bookends to Ansell-Pearson’s analyses. In an essential passage from the first essay (34-35), Ansell-Pearson briefly charts out this evolution in Bergson’s own philosophical trajectory. In Time and Free Will (1889), he notes, Bergson saw duration primarily as a phenomenon of consciousness. The innovation of this book was primarily to have shown that, even as a psychological phenomenon, duration must be conceived as a non-spatial and continuous multiplicity (hence the focus of the first essay, which is entitled “Time as a Virtual Multiplicity”). By the time of Matter and Memory (1896), however, Bergson was asking whether this non-spatial time or duration could be extended to matter or external things—”Do they endure in their own way?” (36)—though he remained undecided on the issue. It was not until Creative Evolution (1907), finally, that Bergson reached his mature view that duration is indeed “immanent to the universe,” and not simply a phenomenon of consciousness. Throughout the book, Ansell-Pearson emphasizes the fact that Deleuze’s own reading of Bergson emphasizes “the primacy of ontology over psychology” (15), and in this sense, pushes Bergsonism in a Heideggerian direction, despite Heidegger’s own “peremptory critique of Bergson” (207). In Deleuze, this transition is exemplified in his emphasis on the “difference,” “multiplicity,” and “virtuality” that he finds operating within or beneath Bergson’s own concepts.


2. The Concept of the Virtual. This leads to the second theme: Why is the notion of “virtuality” needed to account for this primacy of the future, and to conceptualize the new? In a superb discussion of Bergson’s famous critique of the category of the possible (74-86), Ansell-Pearson shows that “virtuality” is a modal concept that is meant to replace the appeal to “possibility.” Modal logic, Bergson argued, “sees in a new form or quality only a rearrangement of the old and nothing absolutely new” (85), just as mathematics tends to reduce complexity to calculability (76). This is because we tend to think that a possibility logically “pre-exists” its reality, and that certain possibilities are excluded once one of them is realized. It is possible, for instance, that instead of coming to the office today, I could have stayed home, or gone to the beach, or fallen ill and died; now that I am at the office, these other possibilities can no longer be “realized.” But this process of realization, as Deleuze had already showen, is subject to two rules—one of resemblance and one of limitation. On the one hand, the real is supposed to resemble the possibility that it realizes. From the viewpoint of the concept, there is no difference between the possible and the real. The concept of the thing is already given as “possible,” and simply has existence or reality added to it when it is “realized.” Moreover, the process of this “realization” remains obscure: existence always occurs “as a brute eruption, a pure act or leap that always occurs behind our backs.” On the other hand, since not every possible is realized, the process of realization involves a limitation by which some possibles are supposed to be repulsed or thwarted, while others “pass” into the real. But this is where the slight of hand becomes obvious: if the real is supposed to resemble the possible, is it not because we have retrospectively or retroactively “projected” a fictitious image of the real back into the possible? In fact, it is not the real that resembles the possible, it is the possible that resembles the real. It is these two presuppositions that prevent the category of the “possible” from providing a genuine concept of the “new.”

It is almost as if philosophy has not yet caught up with the conceptions of time developed in evolutionary biology and elsewhere in science. In a discussion of Daniel Dennett’s book Darwin’s Dangerous Idea, for instance, Ansell-Pearson argues that Dennett, because he construes the production of the new in evolution “in terms of the instantiation of an algorithmic procedure” (84), effectively falls prey to this Bergsonian critique and “reduces the time of evolution to the space of logical genetic possibility” (84). It was Deleuze who first argued that the “possible-real” pair should be replaced by the “virtual-actual” pair in order to adequately think the new. This is not merely a change in terminology. As Deleuze argues, the “rules” of virtuality are no longer resemblance and limitation, but difference and divergence. The virtual is itself entirely differentiated; and in actualizing itself, it does not proceed by limitation or exclusion but rather must create its own lines of actualization in positive acts that require “a process of invention” (72), such that it diverges or differentiates itself from itself. In this manner, it provides for a real conceptualization of the new. By contrast, when Dennett characterizes evolution as the instantiation of a set of possibilities by means of an algorithmic process that operates on “discrete informational units” (72), he is speaking as if these possibilities were already pre-given in the logical combinatory, and that evolution is simply the realization of certain possibilities, to the exclusion of others. Ansell-Pearson argues that Bergson’s concept of durée must itself be conceived of in virtual terms, as a “virtual multiplicity” (Essay One); and the virtual, in Deleuze’s formulation, is “what differs from itself” (5). In this way, indetermination, discontinuities, and ruptures (74) are introduced immanently into time, which itself becomes the condition of the genuinely new. Karl Popper once wrote that “the future is not determined but indeterminate, and the illusion of change is a real one since we do, in fact, experience change” (49). Likewise, for Bergson, “discontinuity…is an integral and essential part of his conception of the continuity of life” (88). Being is difference; the future is truly generative of the new, and not merely readable off the past; and the virtual is the dimension that accounts for this newness.


Several other themes are taken up in the book as well. In essay four, “The Simple Virtual,” Ansell-Pearson turns to a discussion of Alain Badiou’s claim (in Deleuze: The Clamor of Being) that Deleuze is not a philosopher of multiplicity, but rather a philosopher of the One (a “Platonism of the virtual” [97, 103]). While Ansell-Pearson rejects Badiou’s unconvincing thesis, he nonetheless takes up Badiou’s claim and pushes it in a positive new direction, arguing that there is indeed a renewed concept of the One in Deleuze—ignored by Badiou—which is derived directly from Deleuze’s concept of a virtual multiplicity, and must be seen as a component of that concept, and not the inverse. This is the notion of the One as “the open whole of evolution” (104)—a “ceaseless invention of forms” (104). As a component of the concept of a virtual multiplicity, the notion of the One takes on a new meaning: “The whole, qua virtual whole, only exists in terms of its divisions and differentiations” (95). The error of mechanism, according to Bergson, was that it focused attention “only on those isolable systems that it has detached from the whole” (87).

Essay two (“’A Life of the Real’ and a Single Time: Relativity and Virtual Multiplicity”) takes up Bergson’s notorious debate with Einstein on the question of relativity. As long as Bergson is seen to have emphasized an overly psychological or phenomenological interpretation of relativity, then it must be granted that he lost the debate. Ansell-Pearson shows, however, that the outcome is less clear if one sees Bergson as criticizing Einstein for now having misunderstood the difference between metric and non-metric (i.e., virtual or durational) multiplicities. “Is time to be treated as a virtual and continuous multiplicity or an actual and discrete one?” (58). Essay six (“Virtual Image: Bergson on Matter and Perception”) presents a detailed reading of Bergson’s Matter and Memory, while essay five (“The Élan Vital as an Image of Thought”) rounds out the book with a comparison on Bergson and Kant on the question of teleology.

At times, in reading the book, the reader is not quite sure if Ansell-Pearson is himself a Bergsonian influenced by Deleuze’s reading, or a Deleuzian emphasizing the latter’s Bergsonism. His is a synthetic project that draws primarily on three different sources—Bergson, Deleuze, and contemporary evolutionary theory—and there were occasions when it would have been useful for him to spell out more clearly the differences between these sources. Deleuze, for instance, was highly critical of Bergson on several points. He found Bergson’s critique of the concept of intensity “unconvincing” (Difference and Repetition, p. 239) and devoted much of his own work to developing a novel conception of intensity. Similarly, although his two-volume study of cinema is based on a Bergsonian schema drawn from Matter and Memory, Deleuze nonetheless opens The Movement-Image with an incisive critique of Bergson’s dismissal of what he called, in Creative Evolution, the “cinematographic illusion.” Ansell-Pearson himself is, of course, aware of these differences. In the introduction, he stresses that “it is inadequate to describe Deleuze as a Bergsonian, not simply because of the many and varied sources he draws upon, but because of the highly innovative character of his Bergsonism” (3). In the essays themselves, however, these differences are sometimes passed over rather quickly. In Bergsonism, for instance, Deleuze followed Bergson and spoke of the “simplicity” of the virtual, whereas in Difference and Repetition, when speaking on his own account, Deleuze held that the virtual should be understood not as simple but as entirely differentiated. This distinction, it seems to me, tends to get elided in Ansell-Pearson’s discussion of the topic in essay three.

Philosophy and the Adventure of the Virtual: Bergson and the Time of Life is an important work whose themes will help define the center of philosophical reflection in continental philosophy in the years to come. The book is indispensable reading for those interested in Deleuze, Bergson, and the philosophy of the virtual.