Philosophy and the Christian Worldview: Analysis, Assessment and Development

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David Werther and Mark D. Linville (eds.), Philosophy and the Christian Worldview: Analysis, Assessment and Development, Continuum, 2012, 288pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441108692.

Reviewed by James Kellenberger, California State University, Northridge


This volume is a celebration of the philosophical work of Keith Yandell. The editors and the authors of the book's thirteen essays dedicate the volume to Yandell. Although only four of the essays draw upon Yandell's works, all or nearly all, and some more than others, are in the spirit of his philosophical approach in the issues they treat and the method of their treatment.

The first essay is by Yandell himself and asks, "Is Philosophy of Religion Possible?" Not surprisingly his answer is in the affirmative. (A negative answer would have cast a pall over the succeeding chapters.) He addresses three areas within Philosophy of Religion: epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics, which sets up the division of the volume. Three of its four parts correspond to these three areas. The initial part, which contains Yandell's essay, is entitled "Religion and Worldview Assessment."

Not all of the authors who refer to Yandell and discuss his work are in complete agreement with him. William Wainwright acknowledges that Yandell is exceptional in comparison with many investigators, in having both philosophical sophistication and knowledge of the history of religions, and praises him for his "sophisticated defense of the cognitive value of monotheistic experience" (112). But he is critical of Yandell's understanding of introspection and ineffability, as well as of his reading of Jain, Buddhist, and Christian experiences, and his use and understanding of the category of the numinous. Terrence Penelhum, whose chapter treats David Hume on religion and Yandell's assessments of Hume's work, has admiration for Yandell's scholarship, but likewise does not agree with Yandell on every point.

Another contributor, who does not mention Yandell, examines a religious tradition other than Christianity. Paul Reasoner compares the Confucian concept of ch'eng (sincerity, integrity) with the Christian concept of imago Dei (human being in the image of God). Yandell of course has examined and commented on religions other than Christianity. However, Reasoner's effort to find similarities between ch'eng and imago Dei, while not discounting differences, is quite different from Yandell's critical effort to assess different religious worldviews through the evaluation of different religious doctrines.

Chapters more congruent with Yandell's approach and concern, and with his effort to defend Christianity's worldview, are those on the problem of evil and on naturalism, and the book's three concluding chapters in Part Four "Religion and Metaphysics," although only one of these five chapters refers to Yandell. Michael Peterson's essay on the problem of evil, "Christian Theism and the Evidential Argument from Evil," criticizes both William Rowe's argument from evil against the existence of God and counter-efforts, including Alvin Plantinga's felix culpa theodicy, before offering a "new direction for theodicy", jettisoning the principle that God can permit an evil only to bring about a greater good or to avoid an equally bad or worse evil (187). Such a new direction, informed by Christian theology, Peterson believes will help to confirm the Christian worldview. Paul Copan examines naturalism, which is a worldview as much as Christian theism or the worldviews of other religions, and argues that theism has a greater explanatory power than naturalism regarding consciousness, moral value, and more.

The book's final three chapters are on different metaphysical issues within philosophy of religion. Each defends a metaphysical and theological thesis important for Christianity. William Hasker does not mention Yandell, but his effort to answer Jaegwon Kim's argument against mind-body dualism and to defend his own version of dualism fits into a general defense of the Christian world view, assuming that a part of that worldview is survival of bodily death. Hasker's "emergent dualism" may be seen not only as filling out in a new way the concept of soul but also as aiding the credibility of the immortality of the soul (although Hasker does not draw this implication), just as Descartes saw his reasoning about mind and body in the Meditations as supporting the belief that "the human soul does not perish with the body."

Noel Hendrickson addresses the issue of free will's relation to divine foreknowledge. He offers his "Explanatory Approach" as a new tack into this issue, and as well into methodological and "motivational" issues relating to free will. At least as far as the issue of free will and God's foreknowledge is concerned, his effort furthers Yandell's treatment. Hendrickson acknowledges and critiques Yandell's analysis, but his own effort is continuous with Yandell's in using his categories, though he offers a significant emendation in terms of his new tack or approach.

David Werther considers whether Christ as fully divine could have given in to temptation -- was capable of having given in to temptation. In the dilemma Werther presents, if Christ could have given in to temptation, he is not fully divine; but if he could not have, he is not fully human. Several ways out of this dilemma are scrutinized by Werther, and he comes down on the side of Richard Swinburne's resolution: though fully divine Christ could have given in to temptation, not to do what is wrong, but to choose a lesser good. Werther does not mention Yandell, but his pursuit of this metaphysical and theological issue is clearly in line with Yandell's effort to defend the Christian worldview.

Some questions arise. One relates to the title of the book Philosophy and the Christian Worldview. Is there but one Christian worldview? We might think that there is: Christian theism. On the other hand, if a religious worldview is filled out by doctrinal beliefs, then, fairly clearly, within the broad spectrum of the Christian tradition there might be several worldviews filled out by different (and sometimes competing) doctrinal beliefs.

Another question relates to rationality. "Yandell," Harold Netland says, "has . . . addressed the question whether we can assess rationally the claims made by various traditions," and, he continues, "not only does he argue persuasively that rational evaluation of alternative worldviews is possible, but his writings demonstrate how this might be done with respect to certain Hindu or Buddhist claims about religious experience or the nature of the person" (30). Netland cites several works by Yandell, though not his chapter in this volume, in which he seems to be doing just this regarding Jain and Buddhist understandings of their religious experience. It may be that the criticisms Yandell raises can be replied to by a savvy Jain or Buddhist thinker (as I suspect they could be); however the larger question might be whether a Jain or a Buddhist could rationally accept his or her respective worldview despite such difficulties and tensions, as Christians accept a Christian worldview with difficulties and tensions -- a question that may be raised irrespective of whether there is one or several Christian (or Jain or Buddhist) worldviews. Yandell explicitly says that there are "different accounts of what the rational standards are," and he says, "I will not discuss them here" (11). Given the centrality of this notion to his enterprise, and to that of a number of the essays, this may seem surprising. Some might think that it is perfectly rational for those raised in a religious culture to accept the religion of their culture.

Yet another question has to do with the penetration of Yandell's analysis and evaluation of the other-than-Christian worldviews that he addresses. Wainwright's detailed critique of Yandell's treatment of Jain, Buddhist, Advaitist -- and Christian -- religious experience raises relevant questions here.

Another matter deserves attention. In the introduction we are reminded that "to believe [something] is true entails believing that its denial is false" (3). That is, if we take something to be true, we will, logically, take its denial to be false, and as well all other claims that are incompatible with it. So far so good. But this means, religious exclusivists point out, that if we take the claims of our religion to be true, then we must take the claims of other religions that are incompatible with the claims of our religion to be false. The claims, or doctrines, of a religion cluster into that religion's worldview, we may say. So if one takes the worldview of one's religion as true, one must take the worldviews of other religions that are not compatible with it to be false. So far this seems to have the sweetness of reason. And at this point we appear to be in the inescapable position of taking at least some of the other religions of the world, or their worldviews, to be false, for it does seem, after the dust of different mitigating efforts has settled, that the various great religions of the world have central and significant doctrines that are incompatible with each other.

Evaluating religious worldviews, accepting the one that is true (doubtless it will be one's own), and rejecting or denying those religious worldviews incompatible with it, as Yandell and others envision it, involves comparing Christian theism with Eastern nontheistic worldviews or traditions. But of course if our religion is, say, Christianity its doctrines will deny central doctrines or beliefs of Judaism (Jesus of Nazareth is not the Son of God) and Islam (Muhammad's message supplants the Christian message) and, furthermore, our form of Christianity may be incompatible with other forms, depending on the specificity of the doctrines that fill in our worldview. Do Protestantism and Catholicism have different worldviews by virtue of their different beliefs about papal infallibility? And, come to think of it, do different Protestant denominations have different worldviews by virtue of those doctrinal differences that have proven schismatic? Exclusivism, rigorously applied, may be exclusive indeed.

Religious exclusivism is opposed to religious pluralism (leaving aside inclusivism, which is recognized in some typologies). Pluralism in this volume tends to be portrayed as the view that all religions are equally true, or as Netland characterizes it in his chapter, which is on religious pluralism, it is the "view that all of the major religions are (roughly) equally true and provide equally legitimate ways in which to respond to the one divine reality" (30). The authors of the introduction understand the issue between exclusivism and pluralism as being about religious truth claims or doctrines. It is this understanding of the issue that leads to the dismissal of religions other than one's own as false or untrue. A very different construction sees the issue as about which religions are rightly related to God or religious reality. Only occasionally do the authors of this book's essays indicate an awareness of this very different way of understanding the relationship between religious traditions. Netland in the passage just quoted sees religious pluralism as holding that all the major religions are "(roughly) equally true" and provide different but "equally legitimate ways" of responding to divine reality. But Netland's criticism of pluralism focuses on internal problems of John Hick's "plualistic hypothesis", including Hick's view of religious truth claims, and not on the pluralistic perspective that various religions can provide a right relation to God or the transcendent.

Having a right relation to God may be very different from having only true beliefs about God. The questions "Could one have false beliefs about God and yet be close to God?" and "Could one have a detailed set of true propositional beliefs about God and yet be far from God?" are beyond the horizon of this book, it seems. Calvin distinguished between "two kinds of faith." One is belief in God and in Christ. The other, which believes that God exists and accepts other propositional truths about God and Christ, "is of no importance," Calvin said: it is held in common with the demons who believe and shudder. There is not a whiff of concern with either Calvin's perception or the Kierkegaard's perception that at the heart of religious commitment is what he called "subjective truth," which he contrasted with accepting the "objective truth" of Christianity's claims (which he did not deny). A view held by Calvin is discussed in one essay, Penelhum's, and Calvin is cited in another; however, his challenging view on propositional faith is not acknowledged. Kierkegaard receives less attention. Philosophers not seen as belonging to the analytic tradition are rarely drawn upon or mentioned. Kierkegaard is mentioned once, by Wainwright, in passing.

One should, however, keep in mind the intent and focus of this volume, and the analytic tradition into which it fits. All the essays are lucid and provocative. Each rewards close attention. All exhibit attributes that are associated with the analytic style: clarity and finely worked analytic reasoning. Some, in particular Wainwright's and Reasoner's chapters, treat with sympathy and care religious traditions other than Christianity.