Philosophy and the Interpretation of Pop Culture

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William Irwin and Jorge J. E. Gracia (eds.), Philosophy and the Interpretation of Pop Culture, Rowman and Littlefield, 2007, 297pp., $28.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780742551756.

Reviewed by Sarah Worth, Furman University


Much has been written about the relationship between philosophy and pop culture in the last few years.  Beginning with William Irwin's edited collection Seinfeld and Philosophy: A book about Everything and Nothing (Open Court, 1999), adding The Simpson's and Philosophy: the Doh of Homer (Open Court, 2001) and on to Buffy the Vampire Slayer, the Matrix, Superheroes, Baseball, Star Wars, Harry Potter, and South Park among many others, the field has exploded with philosophical interpretations of our favorite popular topics.  All told at this point there are thirty-five collections on various aspects of popular culture and its relationship to and interpretation of philosophical issues (twenty-five by Open Court and ten by Blackwell).  These books are indeed very popular as well, being some of the first philosophy titles to hit the best seller list.  I became painfully aware of how well they have permeated even the lay reader when I was teaching an Introduction to Philosophy course recently.  I asked a student if there was anything she knew for certain as we started talking about Descartes.  She replied "I have read the Matrix and Philosophy, so I know what you are looking for -- of course I don't know anything for certain."  Whatever one's liking is for relating the substantive, serious, classic philosophical issues to the fluff of popular culture, these books have made some serious inroads to connecting philosophers and philosophy to the "real world."

Philosophy and the Interpretation of Pop Culture is an edited collection resulting from a conference on the topic held in Buffalo in April, 2004.  From the list of contributors alone it is clear that this is an issue that is getting some serious attention by the world of academic philosophy.  Heavy hitters such as Noël Carroll, Ted Cohen, Richard Shusterman, Jorge Gracia, and Gareth Matthews are all contributors to the volume.  What I think is especially notable about the list of contributors more generally is that they are not all aestheticians, but are well-known philosophers in an array of fields.  But this collection is not just another group of essays connecting various aspects of popular culture to philosophical topics.  This is meta-philosophy of pop culture -- philosophy about philosophy of pop culture.  For this reason, it stands apart from the other books, which examine philosophy through some particular aspect of pop culture.  As Irwin says in the introduction, philosophy as a discipline has "had a public relations problem for a couple of centuries now, so engagement with popular culture is not an opportunity we can afford to miss" (3).  This collection examines carefully how we might best cultivate this developing relationship between philosophical insight and popular culture in an interesting and effective way.

The book is divided into two sections: the first on "Philosophy and Popular Culture," and the second on "Interpretation and Popular Art Forms."  The first deals with the theoretical issues, concerns, and limitations of the interaction of the two fields, and the second includes essays in which philosophers deal with a specific artistic medium of popular culture.  These media include television, horror films, children's literature, comic books, Rock' n' Roll, and photography.  I found the first section considerably more interesting and useful than the second, as it dealt with the meta-issues of what the possibilities are with the courting of philosophy and popular culture in general.  The books on the various popular topics "and philosophy" for the most part do not deal with the theoretical issues that concern the limitations of the philosophical use of popular culture, so these essays are particularly helpful in considering the value of doing this kind of philosophy.  The second half of the collection focuses less on theoretical issues generally than on issues of interpretation that arise within particular genres of popular art.  Although some might assume that popular art might be more transparent than high art and is in no need of interpretation, Irwin suggests in his introduction that this view is mistaken.  The hermeneutic issues raised here are not necessarily novel ones, but as they are raised here they give the reader a good sense of how some of the classic problems in philosophy (and in particular in aesthetics) get fleshed out when applied in a new way.  These essays are particularly helpful in understanding the unique issues connected with each medium.  I will give a short summary of the issues dealt with in each of the essays in what follows.

Carolyn Korsmeyer, in her essay "Philosophy and the Probable Impossible," deals with the epistemological question of whether art itself (or in this case popular entertainment) can do philosophy.  She questions specifically the kinds of examples from which we might learn.  She suggests that it is not only the classic literary texts that we might gain ethical and aesthetic insight from, but the "probable impossible" plots that we get from popular culture.  She develops an extended analysis of the television show Angel (the sequel to Buffy the Vampire Slayer) as an example of a successful analogy of Simone de Beauvoir's Ethics of Ambiguity.  Korsmeyer argues that "the closer union of [stories and philosophical positions] is indicated by the fact that a well-developed philosophical position in a story makes the story better -- not just more educational, but better narrative art" (27).  She continues by suggesting that "if philosophical essays are clarified and made persuasive with the judicious inclusion of illustrative examples to explain and convince (and most certainly they are), it is also the case that a story is made stronger and more compelling if the philosophy it evinces is presented thoughtfully and thoroughly as well as clearly" (27-8).  I think this essay is by far the strongest in the collection.  Not only does Korsmeyer show her reader what use popular culture can be to philosophers, she does interesting and effective philosophy herself while making her argument.

Bill Irwin's contribution to the volume, beyond his general introduction, does a good job of establishing the terrain over which the relationship between philosophy and popular culture has, will, and could tread productively.  He uses the essay to define a number of terms relating to this burgeoning relationship between philosophy and popular culture.  He discusses the relationship between high, low, popular, mass, bad, intellectual, and classical art.  Ultimately, his essay is very useful for defining the terms, both literally and figuratively, of the discussion and use of popular culture by philosophy.  Irwin also makes an excellent case for why we, as philosophers, can use popular culture to get people interested in and excited about philosophy.  Philosophy is not popular culture, but Irwin argues, we can "start with popular culture and use it to bring people to philosophy" (47).

Ted Gracyk discusses allusion and distinguishes between artistic and non-artistic kinds of references.  He suggests that artistic allusion does not have to be intentional, although it can be.  He employs the standards in the field, positioning himself in reference to Beardsley, Pucci, and Grice on theories of reference.  Gracyk argues that "allusions involve both illocutionary and perlocutionary intentions, and the pleasure that comes from recognition of an illusion is not always resolved in the immediate recognition of its significance" (82).  In the end, Gracyk points out that it may be a familiarity with alluding that gives many people an entrance point into art to which they might not otherwise have any cognitive access.

Noël Carroll's contribution doesn't stray far from his standard positions on narrative and our engagement with fictional characters.  In this essay he argues clearly and effectively against the theories of identification and of simulation as explanations of how we feel for the fictional.  He dismisses both on the basis that they assume that "the audience's relationships to fictional characters, especially protagonists, involve sharing the self same or nearly the same emotions that the characters suffer" (109).  Carroll argues that this is rarely, if ever, the case.  He suggests alternatively that we have a "pro-attitude" (one that is made of care, concern, or sympathy) toward the fictional characters with whom we engage.

In questioning what it means to have good taste and whether it can be meaningfully applied to pop culture, or even high art, Ted Cohen inquires into what it means for us to make a judgment of aesthetic preference which includes the phrase "better than."  For example, is there aesthetic justification for saying that the Goldberg Variations are "better than" the Simpsons?  Cohen argues that the claim is groundless since there is not necessarily anything in common between the two to be used as a basis of comparison.  Ultimately, Cohen argues a familiar point (one he has made well in "High and Low thinking about High and Low Art" in the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 51:2, Spring, 1993): that what connects us to various and varied works of art is not that there is something common to all of them that we like (we have, he suggests, little consistency of taste); rather, aesthetic communities connect us to one another.  The community that connects me to the other appreciators of the Goldberg Variations is not the same community of appreciators that connects me to the Simpsons.  Since the connection is among the appreciators and not the objects of appreciation, the basis of comparison of works is limited at best.  Although this is a familiar argument for Cohen, I think the article is particularly effective in fleshing out some of the current thinking about aesthetic judgment.

Appealing to his pragmatist roots, Richard Shusterman draws helpful analogies between intrinsic and instrumental values, and entertainment (pop culture) and high art.  Ultimately, he argues for a "transactional" form of value which changes (sometimes rapidly, sometimes slowly) as the culture changes.  Music of the 80s, for example, was fresh and exciting at the time.  Now it is considered "retro" and our ability to appreciate it may not have lessened, but the context has changed.  Shusterman does a nice job problematizing the concept of "entertainment value."

In his essay on television, Paul Cantor deals with some of the philosophical problems related to joint authorship.  With television and movies there is anything but a single author.  So how are intentions to be ascribed?  How is praise and blame to be handed out?  This essay, based largely on his book, Gilligan Unbound:  Pop Culture in the Age of Globalization (Rowman and Littlefield, 2001), points out that the notion of the single creative genius has been passed down to us from the Romantic era, but also from what Cantor calls the "perfect plan."  That is, the Christian tradition of a single creator.  Cantor explains that "according to this view, for any kind of meaningful structure to come into being and function, it must be the work of a single designer, who can bring all its elements into harmony" (175).  Cantor argues effectively against this "central planner" and for what he calls "spontaneous order."  The essay is a nice justification for the philosophical effectiveness of television shows that are commercially successful.

Jorge Gracia's essay on six different film interpretations of Bram Stoker's Dracula (1897) was a bit much to take for a non-Dracula fan.  He addresses three questions of interpretation:  first, do the six films he discusses justifiably get classified as interpretations?  Second, if they are interpretations, what kind of interpretations are they?  And third, what can the answers to the first two questions provide for understanding other kinds of interpretations of popular works (187)?  Although the questions of interpretation are important ones, the depth of the philosophical significance gets lost among the details of the six films Gracia discusses.  Ultimately Gracia grapples with a question that many movie-going-non-philosophers grapple with every day:  how and in what way is the movie related to the text it was based on, and what do we make of the interpretive choices that do not belong to the literary author?

Gareth Matthews is one of the founders of the field known as philosophy for children (P4C).  In his contribution he spells out some of the standard positions of P4C.  First, children's stories can be used as vehicles of and for philosophy.  Second, we have to give up the illusion of "adult authority."  And third, no one is better equipped than Socrates to be a teacher of such a method.  That is, listening to those around us (both children and adults) we flesh out meanings for ourselves.  Matthews' contribution is effective and elucidating concerning some of the most basic philosophical problems that parents deal with every day.

James South follows nicely Matthews' essay with one of his own on the related topic of comic books and graphic novels.  South uses the example of Batman's Gotham City to question how it is that we can or should live under "conditions of damage" (corrupt government).  He appeals to "fugitive ethics" according to which, "promises are paradigmatic" (236).  Ultimately, South shows how Batman, Batgirl and Catwoman, who have no particular superpowers (just gadgets and costumes), are able to subvert the dominant paradigm of a corrupt capitalism to do the morally difficult but decent thing.

Although rock'n'roll is not known for its self-reflective, contemplative nature, Michael Baur uses Don McLean's 1971 anthem "American Pie" to show that this does not necessarily have to be the case.  I found this article interesting, but it seemed to me to be too much the analysis of a single, unique song, rather than a demonstration of how the argument about popular music, and rock'n'roll in particular, can be applied more widely.

The last contribution to the volume considers the role of photography in relation to reality.  Peter Hare fleshes out the question of how, epistemologically, one can know or learn from a photograph.  Photography has been "popular" since its inception, primarily because of its accessibility, and as our ability to manipulate images has become ever so much available, the truth in pictures has become more "flexible," as Hare explains.

In the end, I think this collection is a worthwhile companion for philosophers who might question the merit of appealing to popular culture or those who are looking for explicit philosophical defenses for the proliferation of books which use popular culture to address philosophical problems.  I would definitely add this to a collection of popular culture and philosophy resources, or use it to start a collection that all philosophers -- especially those who want to be able to relate to their students -- need to start.