Philosophy and the Return of Violence: Studies from this Widening Gyre

Placeholder book cover

Nathan Eckstrand and Christopher S. Yates (eds.), Philosophy and the Return of Violence: Studies from this Widening Gyre, Continuum, 2011, 221pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441152725

Reviewed by Samir Haddad, Fordham University


Philosophy and the Return of Violence: Studies from this Widening Gyre is a thought-provoking collection of thirteen essays by philosophers working in the Continental tradition. While some reference is made to empirical events -- the wars and the peace movements of the last century and the terrorism of this one -- the approach taken by the contributors is firmly theoretical, with the focus divided between accounts of structures responsible for violence, proposals for the pursuit of nonviolence, and critiques of other philosophers' writings on this theme. One shortcoming of the book as a whole is the brevity of the essays; in several instances I wanted to read more from the particular author, to see the next step in the argument or justification for a certain claim. But that is inevitable in this kind of edited collection, and most if not all of the authors have written more on these topics in other publications. Philosophy and the Return of Violence is thus perhaps best treated as a sampler of sorts, providing the reader with a diverse snapshot of ideas, analyses, and arguments that can be pursued elsewhere should they pique her interest.

After a short Introduction by Christopher Yates reminding us of the prevalence of violence today, along with some discussion of the work of Walter Benjamin and Iris Young, the book has three parts. Part I contains four essays focusing on politics. John McCumber argues that 9/11 was an attack on philosophy itself, claiming that all of the things commonly cited as the "causes for terrorists' hatred of Americans" are "largely a product of philosophy" (23). As a consequence, for McCumber American philosophers have been drawn into a "life-or-death struggle," whether they care to acknowledge it or not. He then briefly outlines his own proposal for what is needed to defend philosophy, drawing on the Kantian Enlightenment ideals of free and rational debate, the "Dialectical Enlightenment" of a Hegelian understanding of the past, and a "Meta-Enlightenment" view found in Derrida and the later Heidegger that orients thought towards an uncertain future. I wasn't convinced by McCumber's analysis, especially in his conflation of philosophy and American philosophy and his stark characterization of Islamic terrorists as anti-Enlightenment. But his argument does have the merit of ambition.

In the second essay, Dennis Schmidt first discusses ancient Greek conceptions of democracy, guided in part by Derrida's analyses. Privileging the question "'Who counts?' Who are 'the' people?" (32), Schmidt underlines the tensions in democracy: between inclusion and the necessity to produce an outside, and between the drive to equalize and respect for singularity. These tensions, he argues, make democracy the site of contested claims, which accounts for much of its promise. Schmidt then refers to Heidegger to suggest that democracy faces a particular threat in today's world of globalized technology, since this results in a "curious equalization of everyone as an abstraction" (40) and effaces singularity. He concludes by counseling a return to the question of "who counts" in order to recover democracy's dimension of the incalculable.

The next two contributions focus more squarely on violence. Robert Bernasconi analyzes Kant's conception of perpetual peace, highlighting the roles played by providence and a racial hierarchy. With peace an end to be achieved and aligned with a striving for human perfection, Bernasconi argues that the logic of Kant's position entailed that "no price was too high to pay for peace" (48), dramatically raising the stakes of war. Bernasconi then traces the inheritance of this logic in various thinkers and state actors, including Hegel, Jünger, and Kissinger, in order to show that "Kant's writings on peace and cosmopolitanism, the place most theorists still go as a resource for addressing our current problems of war and peace, are better understood as part of the problem than part of the cure" (55). He concludes by advocating Levinas's counter-proposal which makes peace an origin, not an end, encouraging suspicion against self-righteous pursuits. This allusion to Levinas is too brief to be persuasive -- noting of course that Bernasconi has written extensively on this for many years -- but the analysis of Kant remains very compelling.

Levinas also plays a role in Simon Critchley's contribution, which continues his ongoing debate with Slavoj Žižek on violence and political resistance. Critchley critiques Žižek's dismissal of the possibility of nonviolent resistance, charging that "his work lingers in endless postponement and over-production" while being sustained by "a dream of divine violence, cruelty, and force" (64). Less polemically, Critchley returns to one of Žižek's sources, Benjamin's "Critique of Violence," mining its remarks on non-violence and drawing parallels with the Levinasian underpinnings of Critchley's own position. While Critchley's focus on this aspect of Benjamin's essay is informative (it having received relatively little attention in the secondary literature), without knowledge of his prior debate with Žižek some of what is at stake here may be lost on the reader.

In Part II, the essays link violence with identity. Four of the contributions do this by privileging the relation to alterity. In a short, elegant talk delivered in 2000, Paul Ricœur proposes that the fragility of identity explains violent responses to alterity. He argues that this fragility is rooted in both the necessary loss in memory and the unavoidable threat experienced in encounters with others. For Ricœur the fragility is exacerbated for collective identities, since here we lack adequate processes for dealing with loss akin to the practices of individual therapy, and collective memory is particularly susceptible to ideological manipulation.

In the next essay, Bernhard Waldenfels analyzes the experience of strangeness, claiming that it is an irreducible part of identity and existence. He argues that hospitality is one response to the strangeness of the other, with the guest a transitional figure between the outside and the inside, while enmity consists in a refusal of hospitality, expelling the other to a position of complete externality. While intriguing in parts, I found that the generality of Waldenfels' account diminished its force. Richard Kearney does a better job in discussing hospitality in the context of religious identity. Using Habermas's view of religion in the public sphere as a foil, Kearney argues that every religion contains an "untranslatable kernel" that resists assimilation. As a result, there is an irreducible alterity both between and within religious traditions, making possible both violence and gracious hospitality. Finally, Jeffrey Bloechl analyzes the proposals for nonviolent relations theorized by Levinas and Girard. Bloechl first highlights their contrasts -- Levinas describes an asymmetrical relation evoked by the weakness of the other, with nonviolence arising in the general suspension of attachment, while Girard sees a symmetrical relation of strength that produces rivalry, with nonviolence achieved through expenditure in sacrifice. In spite of these differences, Bloechl argues that both thinkers fail to adequately account for personal identity, and he suggests briefly in closing that a psychoanalytic approach is superior.

In the last essay of this section, Peg Birmingham takes a different approach to pursuing nonviolence by teasing out implications of Agamben's philosophy of language. Arguing that Agamben's critique of human rights "is not with the concept of human rights per se, but with the declaration of modern rights" (124), Birmingham seeks to delimit a realm prior to the violence of speech. This she finds in Agamben's idea of "the taking place of language itself" (131), which is linked to gesture, itself distinguished from "praxis (practice, doing) and poiesis (making, creating)" (132). Here the I is exposed, and Birmingham advocates developing a new conception of rights rooted in this exposure. Birmingham's essay is densely argued, and at times hard to follow without substantial knowledge of Agamben's work. She seems to assume that because it is prior to speech and action, both characterized as violent, the sphere she circumscribes will be nonviolent. But why should we accept this assumption? The diversity of structures analyzed in this book shows that violence takes many forms, so merely differentiating something from a violent entity or practice is not enough to ensure its own nonviolence. Birmingham's argument suffers for not justifying this claim.

In the first essay in Part III, James Dodd avoids this problem by directly analyzing the nature of violence and nonviolence, situating them within a phenomenological understanding of the world. In addition to inflicting instrumental damage, Dodd argues, violence has an existential dimension that seeks to disrupt the normal sequence of events. "Violence is opportunistic, seizing upon the contingent in order to suspend the normal in favor of the exception, lending to the real a fluidity that seems to belie all the claims that process and pattern make on action" (142). Violence is thus an instrument that differs from all others in its refusal to conform to the world. As for its opposite, Dodd claims that "nonviolence effectively folds back into an instrumental complex not the refusal of order and process, but the refusal of that refusal that violence is, which has on its part been made something concrete and established" (149). Nonviolence is thus characterized as a force that refuses violence, even as it may keep violent possibilities in reserve, as well as invite the realization of the violent possibilities of one's opponent. Dodd's view is not above critique, and he acknowledges the difficulty of cleanly separating nonviolence from violence given the violent character of today's world. But I found his return to questions of the nature of violence and nonviolence a productive avenue of inquiry, particularly in the second step of the analysis. Informed by a substantial account of violence, Dodd's subsequent theorizing of nonviolence is sophisticated and nuanced.

The next two essays turn to Foucault, arguing that his work has valuable resources for a critique of violence. Johanna Oksala focuses on two aspects of Foucault's approach, the challenge genealogy poses to ontology and the strategy of uncovering the implicit rationality of practices. To explain the first, Oksala provides an engaging account of Foucault's Society Must be Defended, arguing that it demonstrates the connection between politics and violence to be "historical rather than natural" (159). This undermines the view that political violence is an ontological given. For the second, she evokes Foucault's conception of governmentality to advocate treating power networks as practices or games with underlying rationalities, again contesting an understanding of violence as natural. In addition to its clarity, a further virtue of Oksala's essay is her willingness to confront the ambiguities in Foucault's writings concerning power's ontological status and its distinction from violence. In his essay, Peter DeAngelis continues the retrieval of Foucault by providing a comprehensive account of power and biopolitics in order to draw attention to the position and role of violence in it. DeAngelis' presentation of governmentality is particularly helpful, focusing on the dual importance of security and expertise in liberal political rationality. He concludes by arguing that these two elements ought to be the target of a Foucaultian critique of violence.

In the final essay of the book, Ann Murphy offers a welcome reflection on the relation between normative and material violence presupposed by many thinkers in the Continental tradition (and by several contributors to this volume). In past Continental theory one dominant position held that the violence of norms and language has a constitutive role in identity, and is thus prior and causally related to physical violence. Murphy challenges this view through a subtle reading of Judith Butler. While her early work focuses almost exclusively on the constitutive violence of norms, Murphy shows how Butler's more recent writings undermine a strict division between the two realms, to the point where Butler questions the necessity of normative violence. Murphy's conclusion is that the proper relation is not of causality or priority, but one of "remainder," where normative and material violence "are co-constitutive, but irreducible to one another" (191).

As can be seen from this summary, the trajectories followed by the contributors are many, and no single method, thinker, or focused topic unites them. I thus do not feel able to provide a global critique of the collection, and the reader will have noted that the few negative assessments I have given above could be defended by appeal to the constraints of space. In closing, therefore, let me just remark that in reading the book I was struck by the absence -- in all of the essays save one -- of explicit inquiries into the nature of violence and nonviolence themselves. Dodd's essay was the exception, and I have already expressed my high opinion of his analysis. But none of the other authors addressed the Socratic questions of what violence and nonviolence are, focusing instead on structures responsible for violence and those that might make nonviolence possible.

We live in an immensely violent world, and violence has been analyzed for centuries by philosophers in the Continental tradition. As such the desire to press on by diagnosing its causes and determine paths of opposition is perfectly understandable. However, Philosophy and the Return of Violence left me wondering whether, in addition to pushing forward, it would not also be valuable to take a step back. For it may be that our intimate familiarity with violence, in both the world and the tradition of thinking we inherit, has led us to assume all too quickly that we know what it is. If this is the case, then philosophy ought to return to violence, and nonviolence, as explicit objects of analysis. This can be done in tandem with the phenomenological, hermeneutic, deconstructive, and genealogical methods pursued in this book. For despite genuine tensions, both these methods and a Socratic line of questioning stand to gain from this encounter. More importantly, a renewed clarification of what we mean by violence and nonviolence can only help in this ongoing struggle, as philosophers continue to devote themselves to combating the one and promoting the other.