Philosophy as Criticism: Essays on Dennett, Searle, Foot, Davidson, Nozick

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Ilham Dilman, Philosophy as Criticism: Essays on Dennett, Searle, Foot, Davidson, Nozick, Brian Davies and Mario von der Ruhr (eds.) Continuum, 2011, 163pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441146915.

Reviewed by John A. Humphrey, Minnesota State University, Mankato


This book consists of six critical essays by Professor Dilman on five books by five notable philosophers (there are two essays on Davidson). The five authors/books subjected to Dilman's critical eye are, in order, Daniel Dennett's Consciousness Explained, John Searle's The Construction of Social Reality, Philippa Foot's Natural Goodness, Donald Davidson's Essays on Actions and Events, and, last but not least, Robert Nozick's The Examined Life: Philosophical Meditations. One significant thing about this volume is that Dilman began work on it knowing that he had a terminal illness. A second is that Dilman chose "philosophers I would disagree with." Also significant, as well as surprising and refreshing, is that prior to undertaking this project Dilman had not read any of the philosophers whose work he critiques.

Refreshing too are Dilman's terse personal and autobiographical remarks in his too brief "Introduction" and "Closing Remarks", including his admitting that he is "not an avid reader, and what's more, I am a slow reader". Dilman adds that "people always tell me that I write clearly". By his lights, this clarity is a result of his turning a "weakness into a strength". The weakness, he says, is that he feels "uneasy about moving too swiftly from one stage of an argument to the next". While I relate quite well to Dilman's remarks about being a "slow reader", I think most of us who do philosophy for a living can echo Dilman's concerns about "being sure", about "treading slowly" when analyzing the work of others, or when offering our thoughts on matters philosophical. Yet few of us can echo Dilman's claim that "people always tell me that I write clearly."

After reading the essays in this volume (as well as revisiting Dilman's quixotic critique of Quine's philosophy circa From a Logical Point of View, namely, Quine on Ontology, Necessity, and Experience), I came to think that Dilman's vaunted clarity is at least as much a function of his procedure as it is the clarity of his ideas, sentences and paragraphs. That procedure, used in each essay of Philosophy as Criticism, is as follows: Via a barrage of quotations, rehearse the key claims/positions/arguments of one's "target", followed by critical remarks focused directly thereon. Offer faint praise where appropriate, of course, and offer what wisdom one can, often via quotations from Wittgenstein or one's previous publications. The result is an essay that is admirably clear in terms of what is at issue and what is alleged to be wrong with it, rather like a meticulous but sometimes pedantic conference commentary. However, this is not to say that every essay in this volume is little more than a heavy-on-the-quotations conference commentary. Nor is it to say that every essay in this volume lives up to Dilman's reputation for clarity.

Essays 1 and 2 (on Dennett and Searle respectively) exemplify the procedure and are admirably clear. In the last four essays (recall that two essays are devoted to Davidson), however, Dilman is either unable or unwilling (see especially his remarks in the introductory paragraph of the first Davidson essay) to strictly adhere to his quote/critique procedure. And the difference is noticeable. The last four essays give us a Mr. Hyde Dilman as opposed to the Dr. Jekyll of the first two essays. Compared to sober, staid, and careful Dr. Jekyll Dilman, Hyde Dilman is unkempt, wild-eyed, and too often writes from the hip. While neither Jekyll Dilman nor Hyde Dilman is my cup of tea, the former at least writes clearly enough to be found out. In contrast, Hyde Dilman too often boggles, especially in his penchant for curious digressions that seem tangential, at best. Or so it seemed to me.

On now to a more detailed look at the first three essays in Dilman's book.

Dilman on Dennett

The Dennett essay is proof that Dilman and Dennett come from two different philosophical worlds. Nicely enough, Dilman appreciates that he and Dennett are very far apart philosophically: "All I can say is that Dennett and his philosophical allies must be living on a different planet." (p. 15; also, on p. x, Dilman says: "I did not find it easy to enter into these books, because their approach was, in so many ways, alien to me."). Not so nicely, Dilman is convinced, for reasons that I cannot fathom, that Dennett is on a planet that no sane, right thinking philosopher would be caught dead on. Perhaps because my sympathies lie with Dennett here (indeed, my sympathies seemed always to be with Dilman's targets), Dilman's critical remarks often struck me as a bit odd, tendentious and smug.

Below are some remarks from Dilman's essay on Dennett, along with some comments to help readers decide who lives on the saner planet, Dennett or Dilman:

What [Dennett] needs is a clarification of the concept of consciousness, instead of an explanation of it along scientific lines. (p. 2)

Dennett shows no appreciation, for instance, that 'life' means different things. A plant, for example, is alive, but it does not have a life in the sense that a human being does. You can speak of the ingredients that have to come together, and the processes they have to sustain, for there to be a living plant. But human life is of an altogether different logical order. You cannot begin to understand it in these terms." (p. 6)

Hearing music is not just having certain auditory sensations. One has to have lived and learned to hear and enjoy music. You can produce electrical impulses in a brain kept alive in a vat; but who is supposed to be listening to and hearing music? An hallucinating person in a phantom body? We have lapsed into total incoherence. (p. 7)

Consciousness is not and cannot be the product of brain activity -- even though it is true, there cannot be consciousness without the complex electrical activities in the brain studied by neuroscientists. . . . I do not see how learning more about the brain's activity is going to help with the problem of understanding consciousness. The problem is a conceptual one and calls for a different kind of work altogether. (p. 12)

Our mind . . . is a complex of interdependent capacities that we have as flesh-and-blood beings in a life of speech and language that we share with others like ourselves, participating in common pursuits and practices . . . suffused with the forms of significance that come from the life of our language. Here we are in an entirely different logical space from the one in which Dennett searches for our existence as human beings, viz. in the workings of our brains. I do not see that it requires much thought to see that what makes us human beings cannot possibly appear in the workings of our brains. (p. 15)

Consider the second of the claims above. While it is not clear how or why the failure of a two- or three-sentence segment of Dennett's 450+ page book to show an "appreciation that 'life' means different things" threatens his explanation of consciousness, I am confident that Dennett has such an appreciation and that he also appreciates that plants do not have a life in the sense that we do. As for the remainder of that passage, I can make nothing of the phrase, "an altogether different logical order", but it does seem to me that one can not only begin to understand human life by appeal to its biological, or other physical processes, but actually go well beyond the beginnings via such appeals.

As for Dilman's disdain for materialism, it reminds me of the "worthy spiritualist professor" discussed by James in Pragmatism (Lecture III): "I remember a worthy spiritualist professor who always referred to materialism as the 'mud-philosophy,' and deemed it thereby refuted." James offers, by way of Herbert Spencer, a reminder that Dilman, and other anti-materialists, seem incapable of appreciating:

so far as one's opposition to materialism springs from one's disdain of matter as something 'crass,' Mr. Spencer cuts the ground from under one. Matter is indeed infinitely and incredibly refined. To any one who has ever looked on the face of a dead child or parent the mere fact that matter could have taken for a time that precious form, ought to make matter sacred ever after. . . . That beloved incarnation was among matter's possibilities.

Finally, contra Dilman's last remark above, Dennett is not "searching for our existence as human beings". He is trying to explain consciousness without appeals to the miraculous. To take Dennett to task for his failure to "search for our existence as human beings" is to misread him rather than properly critique him.

Dilman on Searle

Dilman's essay on Searle's The Social Construction of Reality is narrowly focused on a single issue, namely, the legitimacy/coherence of Searle's view that socially constructed realities presuppose "a reality independent of all social constructions" (roughly, "physical reality"). Unfortunately, it seems that some of what exercises Dilman is due to his own misunderstanding of Searle's account. Contra Dilman, Searle does not hold that the materials of our social realities all need to be "absolutely raw", nor that such realities all need to begin in a social vacuum. Many social realities, socially constructed realities, are built from or begin in the realm of our social constructions.

Be this as it may, it is clear that what really riles Dilman is Searle's commitment to there being a non-socially constructed reality at all. Dilman makes it quite clear that talk of any such reality is a sure sign of "faulty reasoning with which we are familiar in philosophy", or is due to taking "too narrow a view of language", or is simply "a philosopher's myth". Unfortunately, Dilman fails to convince us that Searle is guilty of any of this. To be frank, similar failures are an all too common occurrence in the essays in this volume. Here is perhaps the most coherent of Dilman's many attempts to convince readers of the silliness of Searle's commitment to something other than linguistic idealism:

To repeat, do the words or expressions 'the man', 'the ball', 'the line', and 'the Evening Star', refer to language-independent objects? Can anything we can think of, identify, classify, or refer to, be independent of a language . . .? Beyond that, all we can find is 'an unknown somewhat', if that means anything! . . . it is 'an unknown somewhat', a philosopher's myth, something of which no sense can be made. (pp. 28-9).

The error here seems simple enough. Dilman is somehow convinced that he is standing up for something deep, wise and important about language and reality when all he is really doing is refusing to use words like 'refer' and 'independent' in perfectly acceptable, normal ways. Balls, to take but a single case, are independent of us, our thought and our language, whereas 'balls' is not. Can one insist, with Dilman, that there is also a sense of 'independent' in which nothing at all can be "independent" of language? Perhaps, although I think any such sense can at best stand alongside our usual sense as an alternative rather than threaten its legitimacy, let alone its sanity or supremacy.

Dilman did make clear that he thought Searle was guilty of neglecting this sense and that Searle's doing so was a rather serious "logical/grammatical" mistake (and allegedly put Searle at odds with Wittgenstein, oh my!). But as far as making this case goes, Dilman does not get the job done, despite a series of reworkings, rethinkings, "re-puttings", a series that epitomizes the sort of academic hysteria against which Wittgenstein inveighed. It's as if Dilman knows that his case against Searle is wanting and so keeps adding to it, in the hopes of lighting upon a convincing account.

It is possible, of course, that I am blind here and Dilman has made his case. But my sense that Dilman is trapped in a fly bottle, out of which most of us have already found our way, prevents me from taking that possibility seriously.

Dilman on Foot

Dilman's essay on Foot's Natural Goodness finds him getting well beyond his usual quote/critique format. Rather early in this essay, he seems to lose sight of Foot's account and the results are not pretty. To say that this essay rambles is an understatement. It is not an understatement, however, to say that this essay is more coherent and rambles less than the three essays that follow it.

Perhaps nothing better reveals Dilman's failure to really "get" what Foot is trying to do, or offer any sort of instructive critique thereof, than the fact that his stated conclusion about her book involves an odd remark involving six 'isms', none of which have much to do with Foot's concerns nor are discussed in any detail by Dilman in his essay. More particularly, the main 'ism' relevant to Foot's account, namely, naturalism, is not among the 'isms' invoked by Dilman in his "conclusion". Near the end of the essay on Foot, after some flattering remarks about her work, Dilman takes much of it back by saying, sans any sort of proper justification, that Foot is misled by philosophy, and he reminds us that philosophy can produce illusion, delusion and misapprehension.

In fact, this book finds Dilman making more than a few less than flattering remarks about philosophy and philosophers. While I am sympathetic to the idea that lots of philosophers are either useless or vicious, to invoke Plato's wonderful way of putting it, and that this is a direct result of their being too long in the profession, I am sure that Dilman and I would disagree wildly as to who are the useless/vicious sorts, and on how to avoid becoming one such. And so I want to say that Dilman's desultory and unflattering remarks about philosophy and philosophers suggest that he is unaware of the extent to which his work exemplifies the ills of philosophers and philosophy that he rightly bemoans.