Philosophy, Black Film, Film Noir

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Dan Flory, Philosophy, Black Film, Film Noir, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 348pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033440.

Reviewed by Angela Curran, Carleton College


Recently many philosophers have examined how film can prompt philosophical thinking about skepticism, personal identity, ethics, free will and determinism, romantic love and the nature of truth, to name just a few topics. But philosophers have given much less attention to how film can prompt philosophical thinking about race. This neglect of this topic is corrected with the publication of Dan Flory's important and thoroughly researched new book. I will begin with a summary of the book, and then devote the last part of the review to raising some critical questions of evaluation.

Flory examines a diverse group of recent American and international films -- ranging from Spike Lee's Do The Right Thing (1992) to Hotel Rwanda (Terry George, 2004) -- that Flory groups under the broad rubric, "black film noir." These films exploit the techniques and themes of film noir in order to advance "blacks' protracted struggle to achieve full social equality" (17), hence the term "black film noir." Over the course of eight chapters, Flory argues that these "black film noir" philosophize by prompting viewers "to reflect upon fundamental human questions like who one is or how one should live" (316). Flory grounds his argument in contemporary philosophy of film, often using analytic concepts developed by philosophers Stanley Cavell, Noël Carroll, and Stephen Mulhall, and by film theorist Murray Smith.

In his Introduction Flory outlines the basic argument that he will use to show that the films he examines philosophize and how they do this. Flory draws on Cavell's and Mulhall's work to show how it is that these films philosophize or more accurately, as Flory later clarifies, how it is that they prompt philosophizing in the viewer (316). Essentially, black film noir philosophizes by getting viewers to reflect upon the social injustices of racism and how these inequalities permeate their lives.

Flory, in fact, implies that "black film noir" is more deeply and explicitly philosophical than many standard film noir. Standard film noir cultivates sympathy with characters living on the social margins and thereby prompts a change in the viewers' understanding of characters living in this social milieu. But because blacks and other racial minorities have often been denied the recognition and rights due them as full-fledged human beings, reflecting on their situation through engaging with black film characters can prompt a deeper, more philosophical sort of reflection. These films "may provoke us to think deeply about fundamental human questions, such as what it is to be a human being or what acknowledgement of another as a full-fledged person might involve" (14).

In Chapter One, Flory argues that the character of Sal (Danny Aiello), the hardworking, white pizza shop owner, in Spike Lee's film, Do The Right Thing (1992), is a "sympathetic racist" and serves as a means by which white viewers can examine their own racist beliefs. In developing a sympathetic, yet critical response to Sal, viewers come to reflect upon how they might be like Sal in harboring latent and unexamined racist attitudes.

In Chapter Two Flory argues that Do The Right Thing offers viewers another sort of imaginative engagement with the film's black characters, what Wollheim call's "central" imagination, in which the viewer is able to "imagine from the inside" the experiences of the character and share his experience. When Radio Raheem (Bill Nunn) dies from the pointless "choke hold" of the police as they go into overdrive to subdue the race riot near the end of the film, white viewers come to understand that Raheem's life is morally equivalent to that of any other character, white or black, in the story (85). Empathizing with the black characters' sense that they are not safe in their own neighborhoods, provides white viewers, in particular, with the means to critically reflect on what life is like for blacks in the United States and how racism diminishes their life prospects (88).

Chapters Three and Four examine Carl Franklin's One False Move (1992), and Spike Lee's Clockers (1995). The former features Dale "Hurricane" Dixon (Bill Paxton), the sheriff of the sleepy Southern town of Star City, Arkansas, another "sympathetic racist" with whom the audience develops a "critical empathy" (117) even as they come to see his views on race and white privilege as deeply problematic. Clockers, a story about black drug dealers who sell their products "around the clock," prompts viewers to reflect on the "full humanity" of the drug dealers (135) as they grasp the social circumstances that lead the young men to drugs and gang violence.

In Chapter Five, Flory examines films that straddle the line between independent cinema and mainstream Hollywood cinema: New Jack City (Mario Van Peebles, 1991), Boyz N The Hood (John Singleton, 1991), Juice (Ernest Dickerson, 1992), and Menace II Society (Allen and Albert Hughes, 1993). Flory argues that New Jack City is less successful in prompting the audience to revise their stereotypes of young, black men because "it does not create sufficient allegiance to its criminals" (160), thereby not affecting a change in the audience's stance toward its gangster protagonists. Flory gives the most praise to Menace II Society, because "the narrative details provided in this film induce viewers to think seriously and systematically about the meaning and value of black human life" and in doing so rises to the level of philosophy (175).

In Chapter Seven Flory examines films that philosophize by prompting viewers to consider what a "full-fledged sense of humanity involves" (225). Films in this category include Eve's Bayou (Kasi Lemmon, 1997), which explores the painful events in the family life of ten-year old Eve Batiste (Jurnee Smollett); The Caveman's Valentine (Kasi Lemmon, 2001), a film about a mentally ill African American man that "encourages us to stretch our imaginations to include such individuals within the scope of envisionable humanity" (243); and Always Outnumbered, Always Outgunned (Michael Apted, 1998), a film about Socrates Fortlow (Laurence Fishburn), an ex-convict, who is trying to go straight and find a decent life for himself (244).

Chapter Eight examines American and international films focused on the problems that socially marginalized groups face and how their situation calls upon us to achieve a "broader perspective" on the human condition (274). Films in this category include Spike Lee's Summer of Sam (1999) and 8 Mile (Curtis Hanson, 2002), the latter based on the life of the white rapper, Eminem. Flory concludes this chapter with films that examine "oppressions that reach beyond U.S. borders" (293). Films in this category include City of God (Fernando Meirelles, 2003); Catch A Fire (Philip Noyce, 2006); The Constant Gardener (Meirelles, 2005); and Children of Men (Alfonso Cuarón, 2006). These films focus "audience attention on matters of social advantage globally while indicating directions for resolution by means of ways of thinking that combine Enlightenment ideals with black critiques of their currently existing configurations" (308).

In the Conclusion it is argued, among other things, that the black film noir Flory examines are more successful in prompting philosophical thinking about race than the critically acclaimed Paul Haggis film, Crash (2005). Crash features several "sympathetic racists" -- Officer Hanson (Ryan Phillipe) and Officer Ryan (Matt Dillon) -- but Flory perceptively observes that the film leaves it very unclear just what it is that these characters have learned from having to confront their racist attitudes. Flory argues that black film noir has opened up new possibilities for "empathizing with still different kinds of human others" (314), and cites as an example, Hotel Rwanda (Terry George, 2004), which he calls a "noir exploration of human corruption as generated by white supremacy" (314). Flory also sums up his argument as to why the black film noir he examines can be said to philosophize.

First, these film philosophize -- or are capable of prompting philosophizing in the viewer -- because they prompt viewers to use "our reasoning capacities to reflect on fundamental human questions like who one is or how one should live" (316). Second, the films provide "new ways to think … by presenting 'thought experiments,' counter-examples, illustrations, or mimicking other dimensions of philosophical discourse" (316). Third, black film noir has the capacity to get viewers to re-examine their everyday practices and the moral and epistemic norms that guide them. In doing this, these films philosophize by getting viewers to understand how much of their moral vision is guided by unfounded assumptions of who is human and what social justice requires of them.

Flory has a wealth of knowledge in the areas of contemporary film aesthetics and critical race theory. However, Flory's methodology often suggests that black film noir simply provides an opportunity to apply key concepts and theories in contemporary film aesthetics. He may miss the point that black film noir offers the philosopher of film the opportunity to debate and examine some of the key claims made in contemporary film aesthetics, especially regarding (1) the place of sympathy and empathy in promoting philosophical knowledge, and (2) the role that films play in philosophical reflection.

Regarding the first point: consider Flory's example of Hotel Rwanda, a film about the Rwandan genocide. Flory argues that the protagonist, Paul Rusesabagina (Don Cheadle), comes to recognize that his faith in white European values has been misplaced when the United Nations peacekeeping forces withdraw and leave him and other Rwandans to be massacred. "As Rusesabagina is led to the depth of this realization and its roots in a banalized, "ordinary" evil of substantially devalued black life in comparison to white, so too is the audience" (315). Here the members of the audience re supposed to alter their beliefs in the white European system of justice as impartial and applicable to everyone, based on their empathy or shared feeling with the protagonist.

But the picture of how empathizing with black characters can prompt a change of beliefs in the viewer needs to be filled out, rather than just taken as an article of faith, as Flory seems to do. As Flory sharply notes, there are different types or ways of empathizing with characters. What he calls "critical empathy" occurs when the viewer shares a character's feelings and viewpoint, but still develops a critical perspective on them rather than adopt them as her own (319). So just sharing the feeling or empathizing with Paul Rusesabagina (Don Cheadle) does not entail that the viewer will have Paul's sense of moral outrage or, more importantly, use his viewpoint to criticize her own beliefs and assumptions.

A related question arises for Flory's view of how sympathy with white racist characters, such as Sal in Do the Right Thing, can lead the white viewer to critical reflection on his white privilege. Flory argues that "sympathy … is generally a more distanced attitude in which we imagine that such and such were the case, whereas empathy calls for something closer to imagining from one's own situation" (41). Flory goes on to say, "By encouraging viewer response to be more sympathetic than empathetic, Lee promotes a mode of detached critical reflection that is not merely Brechtian, but philosophical" (41). But it is not clear what the connection is between having sympathy for Sal and thinking critically about his unconscious racism. Granted that in feeling sympathy for Sal, the viewer does not share his feeling, but imagines what his situation is like and feels for what he is going through. But this does not explain how the viewer can come to regard Sal's character more critically as a result of feeling sympathy for him -- something Flory seems to assume in his argument, but does not support or argue for (40-41).

There is also a question as to whether this critical philosophical reflection is detachable from the viewer's experience of the film -- something she may or may not do -- or if Flory thinks that this reflection is part of every thoughtful viewer's experience of the film, properly understood. Is philosophical reflection something that the film or the viewer does, and is some special sort of philosophical background or knowledge of philosophical methods required for the viewer to philosophize? These are questions Flory briefly touches on, but does not examine in any detail.

Flory argues that black film noir philosophizes, "in just the ways that philosophers do" (175). There has been a great deal of fruitful debate recently on whether films can philosophize and if so, how. Flory, for the most part, seems to opt for the model of how films philosophize provided by Stanley Cavell and Stephen Mulhall. According to this view, films can philosophize because they can prompt viewers to "serious reflection" about fundamental questions of human existence, such as the nature of humanity. Other philosophers have argued that for film to philosophize, it must make use of some specific philosophical methods, such as counter-examples, thought-experiments or perhaps even arguments. Flory gives little attention to the specific philosophical methods that the films he discusses employ. Most often he just says that the film prompts "reflection" and a re-examination of beliefs (316) without considering the specific methods -- counter-examples, thought-experiments, and so on -- that each film uses. Some interesting differences might emerge between these films -- which all seem to become a bit alike in Flory's treatment of them -- if he had examined the different philosophical strategies that each film uses to imaginatively engage viewers in reflection on philosophical issues.

Flory's main argument -- that sympathizing or empathizing with marginalized black characters can prompt philosophizing on the nature of black humanity -- leads me to wonder about the role that emotional engagement with characters can play in prompting philosophical reflection. Flory argues that sympathy or empathy with characters in black film noir makes possible a kind of imaginative access to a new point of view outside the white viewer's experience. Is this method of prompting viewers to re-examine their everyday practices and the moral and epistemic norms that guide them comparable to the traditional methods contained in a philosophical work on race? Or is there something different about the way film prompts philosophizing precisely because it does this through emotional engagement rather than philosophical argumentation? These are interesting questions raised by Flory's treatment of black film noir as philosophy.

Flory's book opens up many new lines of inquiry for philosophers interested in examining how films can philosophize and the role that the emotions play in prompting such reflection. Because of Flory's extensive knowledge of contemporary film aesthetics and critical race theory, there is much we can learn about these areas from reading his book. It is a work suitable for use in mid-level and advanced undergraduate classes as well as graduate classes on aesthetics, philosophy of film, and critical race theory.