Philosophy of Biology

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Peter Godfrey-Smith, Philosophy of BiologyPrinceton University Press, 2014, 187pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691140018.

Reviewed by Brian Garvey, Lancaster University


Writing an introductory textbook on philosophy, or on some branch thereof, presents difficulties that, I would suggest, don't arise to anywhere near the same extent in other disciplines. In philosophy it is hard, and probably impossible, to get agreement among qualified practitioners either on substantive points, or on what the noteworthy positions are, or even on what questions are worth asking. Writing a textbook on philosophy of biology has its own particular challenges, since it potentially aims at two very different audiences. Philosophy and biology students may be unfamiliar with the concepts and ways of working of each other's disciplines. Moreover, much of the subject matter of philosophy of biology overlaps with the subject matter of certain widely-read popular science authors (Richard Dawkins, Steven Pinker, and a host of others). Consequently, students can come to the subject already well-stocked with prejudices. Among the prejudices that recent popular science writing sometimes engenders is hostility to philosophy, and to philosophy of science in particular. A quote from Richard Feynman about the utility of ornithology to birds is well-liked by some popular science writers. In assessing Peter Godfrey-Smith's new textbook on philosophy of biology, I will be considering how well he meets these challenges.

The first challenge has to be met by making a selection of topics to cover out of the many that might be deemed to fit under the heading 'philosophy of biology'. These include some questions that are of the very traditional analytic philosophy (in particular analytic metaphysics) kind, such as 'what makes something an individual?' -- the kind of questions some would call 'pure' philosophy. It also includes some questions that many would consider straightforwardly scientific, but can be usefully discussed by philosophers either because they are of a general, synthesising character, or because the state of our knowledge is currently such that there is much room for speculation. As Godfrey-Smith says in his introduction, philosophy tries to work out 'how things "hang together". . . in an especially broad way', and 'has often also functioned as an "incubator" of theoretical ideas, a place where they can be developed in a speculative way while they are in a form that cannot be tested empirically.' (p. 1) The empirical findings and theories of biology must inform any answer worth taking seriously to questions of the kinds he has described here, as indeed they ought to inform answers to questions of the first, more 'purely' philosophical, kind. Finally (and I do not pretend that this list is remotely exhaustive, or even that it represents clear principled divisions), there are debates around the alleged implications of the theory of evolution for moral questions. These are of interest to philosophers because biologists -- or at least people drawing inspiration from biology -- here encroach on matters that have traditionally been part of philosophy's subject matter. Oddly enough, people who believe that evolution is relevant to moral questions seem to spend much of their time arguing that it is relevant, rather than showing what the relevance is. In any case, there is a role for philosophers to evaluate these relevance claims, in part because the claims are often made by non-philosophers with little knowledge of what the questions discussed by philosophers actually are (e.g., Edward O. Wilson, Sam Harris.)

Godfrey-Smith makes a judicious selection from issues within all of these classes of issues, avoiding giving undue weight to one class or another. As an example of the first ('pure' philosophy) kind, let's take the question about individuals. Godfrey-Smith rightly recognizes that our growing understanding of biology renders some intuitively appealing ideas about individuality problematic, and not only that, but it renders some answers that superficially appear to be scientifically informed -- such as ones that define biological individuals by genotype -- problematic as well. He shows how there are a number of dimensions along which entities can vary -- bottlenecking, reproductive specialisation, and overall integration -- that can affect whether we should call something an individual or not. He also notes that there are good reasons for thinking of individuality as something that evolves -- that is to say, lineages of things can start off as individuals and lose the characteristics that made them such. The origin of eukaryotic cells provides one example of this, but it is far from being the only one.

Examples of general synthesising questions with which Godfrey-Smith deals are those about the relationship between organism and environment, and about the 'tree of life'. The widespread image of organisms adapting to their environment by natural selection was challenged by Richard Lewontin and others who present an alternative picture of organisms actively shaping or even 'constructing' their environment. Lewontin's concept of 'construction' applies to the physical altering of environment that all living things cannot help but do, but also to the selecting of environment and to the fact that the type of organism determines which bits of its physical surroundings constitute its environment. Godfrey-Smith presents this debate clearly and fairly (pp. 54-59), and concludes that while it is 'hard to work out whether there is anything substantial at stake' (p. 58), there is a genuine substantial question of whether, in any given case, an organism responds to change by changing its environment or by itself changing. Since there are many genuine cases of the former, adaptation in the sense of an organism changing to fit its environment 'is not so ubiquitous.' (p. 59) The 'tree of life' is another popular image that has been challenged, notably in the work of Lynn Margulis, and Godfrey-Smith deals with it on pp. 113-119, in the context of a chapter on "Species and the Tree of Life". Following Margulis' discovery that many of the organelles within eukaryotic cells are descendants of what were separate organisms, some biologists have suggested that the image of a tree should be replaced with that of a net or web. Nonetheless, Godfrey-Smith argues we should not conclude from that that the shape of the history of life is a mere imposition based on our interests: there still are pre-existing patterns of ancestry, even if the shape of those patterns is not tree-like.

Among the speculative ideas related to biology, the ones that have been discussed most by philosophers, and certainly that engender the most heated controversy, are those where evolutionary biology is applied to understanding human psychology. Sociobiology and its main successor-paradigm, Evolutionary Psychology, have by some been touted as the only way to give the human sciences the grand unifying theory they allegedly need. But by others they have been condemned as irresponsible speculation, and very often as ideologically motivated speculation at that. Godfrey-Smith's discussion of these issues is in a chapter entitled "Evolution and Social Behavior", which it shares with a discussion of the evolution of co-operation in general. He does not directly address the more controversial aspects of Evolutionary Psychology, such as its alleged sexist or politically quietist implications. But he does conclude, as do many of Evolutionary Psychology's left-wing critics, that 'human nature' is more made than found. However, since he sees this making as a population-level, evolutionary process -- 'A new characteristic that is "abnormal" now might be the basis for a new nature in the future' (p. 142) -- the similarity that he claims between this thought and Sartre's ideas seems to me to be tenuous. In the same chapter he deals very briefly indeed with the supposed implications of evolution for moral questions. He is dismissive:

If some behavior has an evolved function, all that means is that it has been associated with reproductive success and has been kept around for that reason. The fact that some habit or characteristic is "natural" in this sense does not, and should not, prevent us from criticizing it and perhaps trying to change it. (p. 142)

The two-audience problem requires that anyone writing an introduction to philosophy of biology has to be willing and able to give explanations of terms from the two different subjects in a way that is comprehensible to the absolute beginner in each discipline, while not making the text boring for the more advanced student. Students will be turned off if a lot of time is being spent explaining things they already know. In general, Godfrey-Smith's explanations of terms are both brief and lucid, and should not alienate either of the potential audiences. However, I would question the wisdom of placing so early in the book -- in the first full-length chapter after what is in effect a short introduction -- a discussion of the very technical issue of laws, mechanisms and models. This, I fear, will strike many students from both groups as an arid debate. I hasten to add, though, that Godfrey-Smith's treatment of this material cannot be faulted.

It is, in my opinion, a key responsibility of those of us who teach philosophy of biology to combat some of the prejudices and loose thinking that float around the wider culture about biology and evolution. (Lest this seem an excessively negative and ignoble aim for philosophy, let's not forget that Socrates spent much of his time combating the arguments of the sophists.) Godfrey-Smith does some truly excellent work of this kind. At some points he takes the time to correct widely held factual inaccuracies. For example, he mentions the belief that all the cells in a human body are genetically identical. As Godfrey-Smith points out, this is false because of the phenomenon of mosaicism:

Mosaicism is the presence of different genetic material, due to mutation and other types of divergence, within a single organism. . . . We start our lives from one cell, but mutations accumulate with every cell division. Talk of genetic identity across a person's cells is an idealization; their cells are just very genetically similar. (p. 69)

This may seem to many readers a relatively unimportant point, and it occurs in the context of a discussion of individuality that may be uninteresting to people without the requisite appetite for old-fashioned metaphysical questions. However, it does illustrate Godfrey-Smith's admirable meticulousness and willingness to spend time correcting common misconceptions. Another that he deals with, and a more important one to my mind, is the supposed indivisibility of genes. As quoted on p. 94, Dawkins says that genes 'do not blend' and 'have a flintlike integrity'. But Godfrey-Smith responds that the breaking up and recombination of chromosomes that takes place during the production of sex cells 'does not pay attention to the boundaries between cistrons, or any other units at a gene-like scale.' (p. 94) The reason I think this is a valuable thing to point out is that Dawkins' description of genes as flintlike is part-and-parcel of his more general quasi-mystical way of talking about them; he sometimes calls them 'immortal' as well. So Godfrey-Smith is to be commended for so matter-of-factly dealing with it.

At other points he tackles some of the ideas that float around the subject and that, if anything does, deserve to be called by Daniel Dennett's derogatory term 'deepities'. A deepity is defined as a saying that sounds meaningful and profound, but is actually either trivial, meaningless or false. Since this term is mainly used by the likes of Dennett and Dawkins, it is almost invariably applied to ideas to which they are hostile, which in practise means ideas from the worlds of religion and continental philosophy. But the worlds of popular science and the 'third culture' have their deepities, too. One of those is the saying, much-liked by Dawkins, that 'DNA is information'. This is often glossed as: DNA is more like a text than it is like a physical object, and this supposedly helps to explain why it produces the effects it does in an organism's development, as well as its allegedly unique role in evolution. Yet, as Godfrey-Smith points out (pp. 144-45), one of the distinctive things about a text is that it can be instantiated in many different physical forms, not just in multiple copies: it remains the same text when printed in a different size, a different font, written in ink or pencil or chalk, on paper or on slate, in electronic characters on a screen, or not written at all but spoken. By contrast, the causal properties of DNA, including the effects it has on an organism's development, require it to be in the physical form that it is and no other. A printout of C's, G's, T's and A's would not do it.

To take one final example, Godfrey-Smith takes up the issue of what one might call 'natural selection inflation': a way of thinking where goal-directed activities of all kinds are understood to be forms of natural selection. This can be seen for example in Gerald Edelman's neural Darwinism, Dennett's 'pandemonium' architecture of the mind, Dawkins' memes, and theories of learning that try to explain it wholly in terms of trial-and-error. There is apparently a tendency to believe that, because natural selection does such a good job of explaining how we get designed and purposeful things -- or, if you insist, apparently designed and purposeful things -- from processes that are not in themselves goal-directed, then all designed and purposeful things must be instantiating a process of natural selection. It may appear that anyone who denies this is thereby committed either to mysterianism or to explanations in terms of a grand conscious designer -- at any rate, to something that marks a break in the completeness of naturalistic explanation. It is worth noting in passing that not everyone feels the need for a unified naturalistic world-view with the same urgency, and that those who do not feel it deserve a better answer than the rhetorical jibes to which they are routinely subjected by Dennett, Dawkins and their ilk. Even if one accepts the imperative towards naturalistic unity, and further accepts that the only acceptable naturalistic account of how we get purposeful things at all is natural selection, it still remains tenable that natural selection could give rise to entities or systems that pursue goals in ways that are not themselves instantiations of natural selection.

Evolution by natural selection, built our brains, and maybe nothing else could. But once it has done so, our brains can do things that are smarter than just throwing out new behaviors -- or beliefs -- and seeing if they work. We can engage in logical reasoning and planning (at least some of the time), and shape ideas and behaviors without exposing them at every step. Sometimes variation and selection builds more variation and selection, as in the vertebrate immune system, and sometimes it builds something else. (p. 47)

This, to my mind, is one of the most useful pieces of fire-extinguishing that Godfrey-Smith does in the book.

So, to sum up: writing introductory philosophy textbooks poses a distinctive set of challenges, and writing introductory philosophy of biology textbooks poses an additional set of challenges of its own. Godfrey-Smith meets these challenges most admirably. The few negative points I mentioned along the way are minor quibbles, and this must now be considered one of the very best textbooks in its field. I shall certainly be recommending it to my students.