Philosophy of Experimental Biology

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Weber, Marcel, Philosophy of Experimental Biology, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 374pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521829453.

Reviewed by Robert L. Perlman, University of Chicago


Philosophers of biology have, for the most part, focused their attention on conceptual problems in evolutionary biology, genetics, and development, to the neglect of other philosophical issues in biology. Marcel Weber's Philosophy of Experimental Biology is a welcome attempt to redress this imbalance. As the preface states, "This book explores some central philosophical issues concerning scientific research in modern experimental biology, that is, in areas such as genetics, biochemistry, molecular biology, microbiology, neurobiology, and developmental biology … This book is an attempt to make sense of the explanatory strategies, concepts, ways of reasoning, approaches to discovery and problem solving, tools, models, and experimental systems deployed by modern life science researchers" (p. xiii). The book succeeds admirably in meeting these goals.

Philosophy of Experimental Biology begins with an account of reductionism and explanation in experimental biology. Here and elsewhere, Weber illustrates and enriches his argument with well-chosen examples of biological research. He uses the Hodgkin-Huxley model of the action potential to argue that the kind of reduction that is important in experimental biology is not theory reduction but physical reduction, "the claim that the properties of complex systems can be explained by the properties of the parts and their interactions, where the parts are spatial parts" (p. 20; all emphases in original). Weber gives a good account of the Hodgkin-Huxley model and shows how nerve conduction can be understood in terms of the component parts (ions, ion channels, etc.), organized in neuronal membranes and operating according to physicochemical principles (Coulomb's law, the Nernst equation). He argues--convincingly -- that the goal of much of experimental biology is to apply physicochemical laws to explain biological phenomena.

Weber provides three examples of scientific discovery -- François Jacob and Jacques Monod's repressor model for the regulation of gene expression in E. coli, T. H. Morgan's analysis of genetic linkage and recombination in drosophila, and Hans Krebs' elucidation of the urea cycle -- to argue that, although there are no general rules for scientific discovery, the process is nonetheless rational, involving the formulation and testing of hypotheses, the recognition of experimental anomalies, and the creative modification of hypotheses to resolve these anomalies; he describes the process of scientific discovery as "generative rationality."

The discussion of discovery leads directly to an analysis of hypothesis testing. Here, Weber's example is the controversy over the mechanism of oxidative phosphorylation and the ultimate acceptance of Peter Mitchell's chemiosmotic hypothesis. While Weber gives a good account of the experimental success of the chemiosmotic hypothesis, he leaves some aspects of this controversy unexplained. In the mid-1960s, the community of "ox-phos" researchers was not convinced of the relevance of André Jagendorf's studies of ATP synthesis (photophosphorylation) in chloroplasts; ten years later, however, these same scientists were persuaded by Efraim Racker and Walther Stoeckenius's experiments on photophosphorylation in bacteria. That Racker and Stoeckenius used purified and reconstituted components is important, but doesn't provide a complete explanation. The acceptance of the chemiosmotic hypothesis is one of the few episodes in the history of experimental biology that can usefully be understood as a Kuhnian revolution.

Weber goes on to consider the function of experimental systems and of model organisms in biological research. His account of cell-free systems for studying protein synthesis, which were developed by Paul Zamecnik to investigate protein synthesis in cancer cells but were subsequently modified and used by other scientists for other purposes -- most notably by Marshall Nirenberg and Heinrich Matthaei in their elucidation of the genetic code --illustrates the important role of experimental systems in shaping the course of research. In Weber's words, "experimental systems do not just help to answer questions; they also help to generate them" (p. 312); experimental systems have "a life of their own." Likewise, model organisms may be used by different workers for different purposes. Drosophila, which was developed by Morgan as an experimental organism for genetic mapping studies, ultimately became a tool for cloning DNA sequences. Model organisms, like experimental systems, not only facilitate research but in some ways determine the questions that will be asked. "The choice of certain organisms defines what comes to be viewed as a relevant research problem" (p. 155).

Weber's discussion of conceptual change in biology focuses on the changing meaning of the term "gene." He argues that biological concepts, like species, "do not have a fixed set of essential properties," and therefore have a "floating reference" that is not seen in the physical sciences. The discussion of the changing meaning of "gene" leads to a consideration of the role of genes in development. Here, Weber returns to his ideas of reduction: "explaining ontogeny in developmental biology is a matter of describing the causal interactions between the various components of the developmental system and of showing how these interactions generate a species' characteristic patterns" (p. 262). Finally, the book ends with a discussion of scientific realism and the problem of experimental artifacts.

One of the great strengths of this book is Weber's interest in the practice of experimental biology. He is concerned with the ways in which biologists design, carry out, and interpret their experiments, and the epistemic significance of experimental practices. As he notes, "the philosopher of science is well advised to take the actual judgments of the scientific community very seriously" (p. 111); moreover, "a viable account of theory testing needs to pay attention to how evidence is produced in the laboratory" (p. 118). Weber emphasizes, for example, the role of control experiments, the ways in which biologists interact with and explore the potential of their experimental systems, and the need to search for and eliminate experimental artifacts. This focus on laboratory practice makes the book ring true—it reads like an accurate account of research in experimental biology.

Another strength of the book is its integration of philosophical issues with biological problems. Weber provides clear introductions to both the philosophical and the scientific aspects of his argument, so that the book will be accessible to both scientists and philosophers. Because he relates his own positions to those of earlier workers, readers will understand where he stands, with whom he agrees and disagrees, and why. The book will serve as a good introduction to contemporary philosophy of biology. Only a few sections, such as "Why biochemists are not Bayesians," seem to have been written only for philosophers. Biochemists know that their experimental tests are not statistical and will not be particularly interested in prior and posterior probabilities.

While the book has much to commend it, it suffers from an almost complete disregard of evolutionary biology. Only the section on model organisms discusses evolution. As Weber acknowledges, "the usefulness of model organisms crucially depends on the extent to which the mechanisms in question are phylogenetically conserved" (p. 181). If Drosophila melanogaster were the only organism in which genes were arranged in linear sequences on chromosomes, studies of genetic linkage and recombination in this species would be of only parochial interest. But evolutionary thinking extends beyond its application to model organisms. All of the experimental systems that Weber discusses gain importance from evolutionary considerations, from the recognition "that all organisms are remarkably similar at the level of certain molecular mechanisms" (p. 180). The Hodgkin-Huxley model of the action potential commands our attention not simply because it explains the development and propagation of action potentials in squid axons but because, with appropriate elaboration, it underlies our understanding of voltage and conductance changes in all biological membranes.

Weber recognizes that reductionist accounts of biological phenomena must be supplemented by functional explanations. Unfortunately, however, he adopts a limited and misleading view of functions. Weber argues for a physiological view of functions, in which the functions of biological systems are their contributions to the "self-reproduction," or somatic maintenance, of organisms. In his view, "The capacity for self-reproduction is the most salient capacity that we want to understand in biological organisms--it makes the difference between living things and dead matter" (p. 41). Weber's focus on self-reproduction ignores reproduction in its usual sense. A host of processes, from meiosis to lactation, are legitimate subjects for experimental biology but have nothing to do with self-reproduction. This neglect of reproduction is symptomatic of a broader problem--Weber's account of function is avowedly non-evolutionary. "Functional explanation is not about phylogeny, nor about ontogeny" (p. 40). If experimental biologists rarely invoke evolutionary arguments to support their functional analyses, it is because they take these arguments for granted. The systems that experimental biologists study are complex, well-integrated systems. How could electrically excitable membranes, or metabolic cycles, or any of the other phenomena Weber discusses, have arisen by any process other than natural selection? The importance of these systems is enhanced by the recognition that they are adaptations that contribute to the fitness of the organisms in which they are found (or that contributed to the fitness of the evolutionary ancestors of these organisms).

The disregard of evolutionary considerations leads to both conceptual and political problems. Living organisms are the products of two different historical processes, ontogeny and phylogeny. An explanation of biological phenomena requires an understanding of both of these processes, and an integration of what Ernst Mayr has called proximate and ultimate causes. As George Williams has written, "the principles of chemistry and physics are not enough [to explain biological phenomena]. At least the one additional postulate of natural selection and its consequence, adaptation, are needed." Admittedly, "adaptive claims are notoriously difficult to test empirically" (p. 37); if biologists do not wish to make such claims, they would still need the less restrictive postulate of historical or evolutionary processes. Niels Bohr's ideas about complementarity in biology are not usually taken seriously today, but they did express an important insight -- reductionist and evolutionary (or functional, understood from an evolutionary perspective) accounts of biological systems are complementary, in the sense that both are required for an explanation of these systems.

In the United States, teaching the theory of evolution by natural selection is under constant attack. Proponents of "intelligent design" argue that the "irreducible complexity" of living organisms, their "intelligent design," implies the existence of a supernatural "intelligent designer." As experimental biologists investigate more and more complex phenomena and elucidate more and more intricate regulatory mechanisms, their work lends superficial plausibility to the notion of intelligent design. To combat this problem, biologists need to affirm their recognition that the phenomena they study are the products of evolutionary processes. Weber could have used his discussion of photophosphorylation to point out that a portion of the complex process of oxidative phosphorylation -- ATP synthesis coupled to proton transport across membranes -- could have evolved, and have been an adaptation, independent of the coupling of proton transport to the oxidation of metabolic substrates. Neither mitochondria nor any of the other systems Weber discusses are irreducibly complex.

Weber accepts the standard philosophical view that "all the genuine laws of nature that feature in experimental biology are physicochemical laws" (p. 34). He doesn't seriously entertain the idea that, just as physicochemical laws assume the properties of physicochemical entities, there may be biological laws that depend on the properties of biological entities. Given that populations of living organisms exhibit heritable variations in reproductive success, these populations will inevitably change over time -- in other words, they will evolve. Even though the outcomes of evolution are contingent, natural selection may still be thought of as a genuine, if distinctly biological, law of nature.

Finally, although Weber mentions structure, or form, he doesn't give it the attention it deserves. In his discussion of the Hodgkin-Huxley model, he points out that reductionist accounts of biological phenomena entail descriptions of "the entities and their spatial arrangement" (p. 25). Later on, he notes that the biological concepts that appear in the analysis of the action potential (axon, neuron, etc.) are structural concepts. But spatial arrangement, or structure, is such a critical part of biology that it should probably be given greater emphasis. The history of experimental biology shows an increasing recognition of the importance of structure. Until Morgan's analysis of genetic linkage, genes were thought to be discrete hereditary factors that exhibited independent assortment into gametes. Likewise, before Albert Claude's development of differential centrifugation and the advent of electron microscopy, the cell cytoplasm was thought to be homogeneous protoplasm. Perhaps the most efficient reductionist strategy is to focus first on the component entities and only later, when anomalies arise that cannot be understood without a consideration of structure, to investigate the organization of these components. In any event, the book would have benefited from a stronger account of structure in biology.

Despite these shortcomings, Philosophy of Experimental Biology is an excellent book and will be rewarding reading for both philosophers and biologists. What we need now is a book that integrates the philosophy of experimental biology with the philosophy of evolutionary biology. Marcel Weber is well suited to write such a book; let's hope this will be his next project.