Philosophy of Language and Linguistics, Volume 1: The Formal Turn, AND Volume 2: The Philosophical Turn

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Piotr Stalmaszczyk (ed.), Philosophy of Language and Linguistics, Volume 1: The Formal Turn, 418pp; Volume 2: The Philosophical Turn, 290pp., Ontos, 2010, $307.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380705.

Reviewed by Gilbert Harman, Princeton University


These two volumes contain 42 papers submitted to an international conference held at the University of Łódź in 2009, with short introductions to each volume by the editor. As in most conference proceedings, the contributors to this volume take up a variety of topics. Sixteen of the contributors are from Poland, five are from England, and the rest are from France, Czech Republic, Italy, Spain, Finland, Belarussia, and Brazil. Some of the papers enter current disputes, some challenge widespread assumptions, a few remind readers of contributions of important Polish theorists like Ajdukiewicz, Lejewski, and Leśniewski, a few take up current issues in semantics. The papers are diverse in outlook and show that there is a lively group of people working in the general area of philosophy of language in Europe.

It is mind-numbing to read through the two volumes from beginning to end, just as it would be to read everything in almost any other volume of conference proceedings or to read everything published in the average professional journal in a given year. I will not try to discuss all the papers, but will make some remarks on a few.

Some Papers Offering Particular Semantic Analyses

In "On Truth in Time," Bartosz Więckowski presents a way to interpret statements that seem to be talking about things happening at different times so that they are compatible with the presentist thesis that the only things that exist exist now. There are two basic parts to his proposal. The first is to interpret quantification substitutionally. The second is to suppose that expressions can have not only a reference and a sense but also a third thing, a "sense extension." However, I must confess that I did not understand the second proposal or why it was needed given the first, since substitutional quantification is committed only to the existence of the expressions that can be substituted for the relevant variable.

In "Vagueness and Contextualism," Joanna Odrowąż-Sypniewska discusses a familiar kind of sorites in which for a predicate F there is a series of items 1,2,…,n such that it is clearly true that F(1) and clearly false that F(n) but there is no i and i+1 such that F(i) is clearly true and F(i + 1) is clearly false. She rejects supervaluationist accounts that assign a degree of truth to the F(i), opting instead for a "subvaluation" theory with a paraconsistent logic to allow for cases in which F (i) is both (wholly) true and (wholly) false. She asserts that her theory allows her to reject ( i)(F(i) ¬F(i + 1)). But, if I understand the theory, assuming that F(1) is true and not false and F(n) is false and not true, then for some i, F(i) is true and F(i + 1) is not true, and similarly for some j, F(j) is not false and F(j + 1) is false.

By the way, Odrowąż-Sypniewska wrongly reports Delia Graff Fara (2000) as also rejecting (i)(F(i) ¬F(i + 1)). Fara accepts that claim but adds that we may be unable to accept any particular instance in which F(i)¬F(i + 1).

Piotr Wilkin, in "Proper Names, Causal Chains and Anchoring," defends a causal theory of proper names and explains how an identity statement with two such names can be nontrivial by appeal to something like the mental files discussed by Peter Strawson (1974) and later theorists, although Wilkin does not mention any of these versions.

One worry about any theory requiring that the use of a proper name be anchored causally in the item referred to is that there seem to be uses without such anchoring. There is a good recent discussion of the issue in Robin Jeshion (2010) who suggests, for example, that someone planning to start a business may introduce a name for the planned business and use that name before the business exists and so before there is any causal anchoring of the name in what it names.

Some Methodological Discussions

In their excellent discussion, "Minimalism, Contextualism, and Contentualism," Eros Corazza and Kepa Korta clearly describe issues about what speakers have said in uttering a sentence, taking into account views of Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore, Kent Bach, François Recanati, and others.

In "The Myth of Semantic Structure," Jaroslav Peregrin claims that "the usual notion of semantic structure, or logical form, is actually the result of certain properties of our tools of linguistic analysis being unwarrantedly projected into what we analyze." But it seems to me that this claim is not clearly based on an informed discussion of specific lines of argument that figure in contemporary views of semantic structure.

In "Has Locke's Semantic Theory Been Refuted?" Luis Fernández Moreno suggests a way in which Locke's views can be interpreted to be compatible with Putnam's.

In "Is Meaning Normative?" Andrea Guardo defends the normativity of meaning against Paul Boghossian's objections.

Pius ten Hacken interestingly compares the recent history of linguistics with the history of astronomy in "The Search for a Science of Language."

In "Does Language Have a Use?" Lars Hertzberg offers a negative answer, arguing that we do not use words to say things, because our saying what we say does not come after we utter the words. This seems confused to me, like saying that one cannot use a bat to hit a ball because the hitting of the ball does not come after the use of the bat.

Witold Kieraś argues that only philosophy, not linguistics, can address issues about grammatical complexity, in "Grammatical Complexity, Philosophy and Linguistics." I don't understand this. A recent controversy about grammatical complexity has to do with Daniel Everett's (2005) discussion of Pirahã, and as far as I can tell only linguists and no philosophers are central participants in that controversy.

In "The Formalism of Linguistics: A Gadamerian View," Andrzej Pawelec, claims that creative uses of language are incompatible with Chomsky's generative grammar, but he doesn't explain this in a way I can understand. He also objects that current linguistics is mistaken in that it "treats language as a tool of communication" and ignores its role in thought. On the contrary, Chomsky has from the beginning emphasized the role of language in thought and a very important issue in current theory is whether language evolved in the first instance as a medium of thought and only secondarily as a means of communication (Chomsky 2005).

Appeals to Logics

I have already mentioned Joanna Odrowąż-Sypniewska's appeal to a paraconsistent logic so as to allow vague predicates to be both true and false of an item.

In "Philosophy, Linguistics and Semantic Interpretation," Christian Bassac offers a whirlwind tour of versions and extensions of categorical grammar, leading up to a use of the Lambek calculus to relate sentences with their logical forms. It might be useful to compare this proposal with standard approaches in contemporary semantics that appeal to considerations of categorical grammar, following Richard Montague.

In "An Unresolved Issue: Nonsense in Natural Language and Non-Classical Logical and Semantic Systems," Elżbieta Chrzanowska-Kluczewska asks how non-classical logic might help to characterize the sort of far-fetched metaphors in Catachresis and provides a quick survey of "the contribution of the Polish school of logic to the development of non-standard systems" and later logical developments.

Conflating Issues about Implication with Issues about Inference

I have hoped that it would be generally recognized by now that deduction is a logical notion, and inference is a psychological or epistemological notion (Harman 1986, especially chapters 1-2). But there are cases where these very notions are conflated.

Luca Tranchini, in "Truth: An Anti-realist Adequacy Condition," argues with copious quotation from Michael Dummett's "Justification of Deduction," that an adequate "anti-realistic" account of truth should yield that "a deductive inference is valid if it preserves the truth from the premises to the conclusion."

In "The Logic of Language: Analytic Pragmatism and Inferentialism as a Bridge between Philosophy of Language and Linguistics," Guilherme F. R. Kisteumacher says, "it is simply a mistake to disregard the kind of analysis we can perform on language-use through the application of various kinds of logical tools, together with the mistaken epistemological claims that were put forward by the analytic tradition" (141). I don't see who is supposed to make this mistake. But I do see on the next page: "infer, through relations of logical entailment." And a little later, in italics: "Inference is a distinct kind of logical doing" (151). For no good reason I can understand, this author is against "the mentalistic sort of linguistics" (152).


Chomsky, Noam, (2005). "Three Factors in Language Design," Linguistic Inquiry 36, pp. 1-22.

Everett, Daniel L. (2005). "Cultural Constraints on Grammar and Cognition in Pirahã: Another Look at the Design Features of Human Language." Current Anthropology 46, pp. 621-646.

Fara, Delia Graff. (2000) "Shifting Sands: An Interest-Relative Theory of Vagueness," Philosophical Topics 28: pp. 45-81. (Originally published under the name 'Delia Graff'.)

Harman, Gilbert (1963). "Generative grammars without transformation rules: a defense of phrase structure," Language 39, pp. 597-616.

Harman, Gilbert (1986). Change In View: Principles of Reasoning. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Jeshion, Robin (2010). "Singular Thought: Acquaintance, Semantic Instrumentalism, and Cognitivsm," in Robin Jeshion, ed., New Essays on Singular Thought. Oxford, Oxford University Press. pp. 105-140.

Montague, Richard (1974). Formal philosophy: selected papers of Richard Montague. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Strawson, P. F. (1974). "Proper Names -- and Others," Subject and Predicate in Logic and Grammar. London: Methuen. pp. 35-60.