Philosophy of Mathematics in the Twentieth Century: Selected Essays

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Charles Parsons, Philosophy of Mathematics in the Twentieth Century: Selected EssaysHarvard University Press, 2014, 350pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674728068.

Reviewed by Stewart Shapiro and Teresa Kouri, The Ohio State University


It surely goes without saying that Charles Parsons is one of the most important philosophers of mathematics in our generation. Through his many publications and his teaching and lecturing, he has spawned and influenced a large body of historically sensitive work in the philosophy of mathematics and an equally large body of philosophically sensitive work in the history of the philosophy of mathematics.

This is Parsons' fourth book. It and From Kant to Husserl (Harvard University Press, 2012) collect together most of his essays on other philosophers, with the exception of those essays reprinted in his earlier collection, Mathematics in Philosophy (Ithaca, New York, Cornell University Press, 1983). As indicated by its title, the essays in the present book are on philosophers whose work appeared primarily, or entirely, in the twentieth century.

All but one of the essays have been published elsewhere. It is good to have them collected here, for at least two reasons. First, some of the essays appear in collections that are not readily available, including volumes honoring some of the authors discussed, which are sources that are notoriously hard to acquire. Second, and more important, it is interesting and helpful to see similar ideas and themes developed in different contexts. Four of the essays have new postscripts.

The book comes in two parts. The first, "Some Mathematicians as Philosophers", consists of seven essays. The figures treated there include L. E. J. Brouwer, David Hilbert, Paul Bernays, Hermann Weyl, Rudolf Carnap, and Kurt Gödel, the latter being an especially prominent interest of Parsons. Part II, "Contemporaries", has five essays, covering W. V. O. Quine, Hao Wang, Hilary Putnam, and William Tait.

Although all of the essays are interesting, insightful, and important, there is no single theme, or group of themes, that runs through all or even most of them. We will provide brief summaries of the essays here to sketch the breadth, depth, and content of the book.

"The Kantian Legacy in Twentieth-Century Foundations of Mathematics" marks the beginning of the discussion and sets the tone for the rest of the book. It is the one essay in this collection not published elsewhere. The paper focuses on Kant's influence on Brouwer, Hilbert, and Bernays, particularly with regard to the role of Kantian intuition in their philosophies. It seems that in the middle decades of the twentieth century, there was a general view that the central ideas in Kant's philosophy of mathematics were dead, perhaps due to the progress of mathematics itself. Any interest in Kant's philosophy of mathematics was only historical. Parsons thoroughly debunks this view. Section two focuses on Brouwer's intuitionism and the role that the intuition of time plays there. Section three treats Hilbert's notion of geometric intuition, and the role this plays in his foundationalist project, the much-discussed Hilbert Program. Section four focuses on Bernays's use of "intuition" in his discussion of the finitist methods of proof used by the Hilbert School.

"Realism and the Debate on Impredicativity: 1917-1944" deals with the role of impredicative definitions and mathematical realism. Parsons shows that although realism did play a role in the defense of impredicativity, it was not as dominant as many have thought. The first section examines Weyl's negative attitude toward the theorem that every bounded set of real numbers has a least upper bound, a sort of paradigm case of an impredicative notion. An interesting theme begins to emerge here. Part of the reason for Weyl's skeptical attitude about the theorem is what he refers to as an "intuition of iteration" -- and this harks back to a main theme of the first essay in this collection. Parsons then goes on to discuss Hilbert's and Bernays' responses to Weyl's arguments. Section three gives an explanation of Carnap's remark that Ramsey "[assumed] the totality of properties already exists before their characterization by definition," and section four follows with an explanation of Carnap's own view on impredicative definitions. The concluding section covers Gödel's arguments that the axioms of set theory presume a kind of realism about mathematics. The version of this essay published here is followed by a postscript, in which Parsons addresses related issues that have come up more recently.

"Paul Bernays' Later Philosophy of Mathematics" is particularly welcome in light of the relative neglect of Bernays in the secondary literature on this most important period. Parsons characterizes Bernays's "anti-foundationalism" as seeking to justify mathematical theories by offering proofs of their consistency (p 71). There is an insightful discussion of Bernays's rejection of a priori knowledge and the notion of "degrees of Platonism" in mathematics. This is followed by a discussion of Bernays's structuralism, a view in which mathematical objects exist relative to a given structure. This notion of structuralism was developed before any contemporary discussions of mathematical structuralism, and so Bernays might be thought to be ahead of his time.

The other four essays in Part I all focus directly on Gödel. "Kurt Gödel" is a brief survey of Gödel's work, written from a philosophical perspective. "Gödel's 'Russell's Mathematical Logic'" discusses the argumentative themes in Gödel's influential paper in some detail. The essay is chock full of interesting and important insights, both in the historical context and the philosophy itself. It is made clear to the reader just why Gödel has no problem with impredicative definition, so long as mathematical entities exist independently of our constructions of them, thus broaching a theme of an earlier essay. Gödel's own realism includes not just sets, but also concepts (though, Parsons claims, Gödel never had a worked-out theory of concept-realism). There is also a very helpful postscript, which follows the original essay. There Parsons addresses a criticism of Philippe de Rouilhan, who charges that Parsons overstates his case when he claims that Gödel was not sufficiently sensitive to the intensional character of Russell's logic.

The essay "Quine and Gödel on Analyticity", has an explicit focus on Gödel's positions, since Quine's are better known. According to Parsons, Gödel holds that there is some sense in which mathematical statements are true in virtue of meaning alone, but this is distinct from any sort of Carnapian conventionalism, which Gödel explicitly dismisses. Gödel can consistently claim this, since he holds that some sort of conceptual realism is true -- continuing a theme from the previous essay. An upshot of this concept-realism is that, for Gödel, even though mathematical statements do not express any sort of physical content (in line with Carnap), they do express some objective truth about real entities, namely concepts. Thus, Gödel agrees with Quine that mathematics has content, but agrees with Carnap that this content is not about the physical world. The postscript to this essay contains responses to several scholars who defend Carnap against Gödel on "mathematics as the syntax of language".

"Platonism and Mathematical Intuition in Kurt Gödel's Thought" marks a nice return to the theme of the first chapter, the role of intuition in the philosophy of mathematics. This is, of course, one of Parsons' central interests. Here, again, Parsons shows that Gödel's realism extends not just to mathematical objects but also to concepts. He also gives a historical account of how Gödel came to hold this view, and the textual evidence for it. The discussion of Gödel's notion of intuition in this chapter is more complicated, but that is in large part because Gödel himself was not terribly clear about what he took mathematical intuition to be. One interesting theme of this essay is that Gödel's platonism developed over time. Parsons does an excellent job of straightening out Gödel's discussion of concept-intuition (sometimes called perception). The essay also includes a discussion of how Gödel's views about intuition changed after 1964, with the publication of "What is Cantor's Continuum Problem?" The postscript to this essay responds to a discussion of Gödel on similar topics by Martin Davis.

This brings us to Part II of the book. The first two items here concentrate on Quine's evolving views. "Quine's Nominalism" concerns issues of ontology. On the contemporary scene, "nominalism" is the view that no abstract entities exist; everything is concrete. At one point, Quine did flirt with a full-bodied nominalism, for example in his celebrated "Steps toward a Constructive Nominalism", co-authored with Nelson Goodman (Journal of Symbolic Logic 12 (1947), 105-122). That project, however, was abandoned when Quine came to see that scientific theories seem to presuppose considerable mathematics. Parsons points out, however, that one aspect of Quine's nominalism continued to dominate his thinking, namely his skepticism toward intensional entities like meanings, propositions, and properties. The central thesis, as Parsons sees it, is that predicates, for example, do not designate properties. This is closely tied to Quine's rejection of second-order logic, where bound variables can occur in predicate position. The place of this nominalism in Quine's other main themes, such as his views on ontology and his naturalism, are illuminated in this essay.

The main theme of "Genetic Explanation in The Roots of Reference" is methodological. As noted, Quine's naturalism is the view that there is no first philosophy and that philosophy, properly pursued, is continuous with empirical science. A central theme, of course, is that epistemology should be "naturalized", that it be seen as an offshoot of psychology. The Roots of Reference is an attempt to do just that. Parsons sees this work as an example of the "genetic" method in philosophy, wherein "some important feature of our thought or knowledge is explained by a hypothetical story about how it came to be as it is" (p. 220). From this vantage point, Parsons is able to illuminate a number of themes central to the Quinean picture at that time, showing the extent to which they are compatible with the underlying naturalism. The essay thus serves to illuminate both Quine's own views and the genetic method itself.

"Hao Wang as Philosopher and Interpreter of Gödel" is aptly named. Although Gödel's nachlass contains many deep, subtle, and difficult philosophical reflections, he did not publish much in this area, just two or perhaps three papers. According to Wang, this is due to Gödel's exacting standards of rigor and presentation. Wang enjoyed a unique relationship with Gödel, holding many hours of discussion, often on matters philosophical. So Wang is now probably best known as a main expositor of Gödel's philosophy. However, Wang was also a deep and far-reaching philosopher in his own right. The present essay traces some key themes in Wang's thought, and the influence of Gödel on Wang. The main focus is Wang's 1974 book, From Mathematics to Philosophy (London, Routledge and Kegan Paul).

"Putnam on Existence and Ontology" is as much about Quine as it is about Putnam (and so the essay focuses on two of Parsons' most prominent colleagues at Harvard). The main theme of the article is an attempt to understand just how Putnam understands some of the central Quinean themes concerning ontology. The starting point is a remark of Putnam's, that "the publication of . . . Quine's 'On what there is' . . . had disastrous consequences for just about every part of analytic philosophy" (Ethics without Ontology (Cambridge, Massachusetts, Harvard University Press, 2004, p. 2). According to Parsons, the main target of Putnam's thinking is a tendency found in contemporary philosophy that can be traced to Quine. The extent to which Quine himself is among Putnam's targets is not clear.

The final essay in the book, "William Tait's Philosophy of Mathematics" is actually an extended book review of a collection of Tait's essays, The Provenance of Pure Reason: Essays in the Philosophy of Mathematics and its History (New York, Oxford University Press, 2005). So that makes the present work a sort of meta-review. At the outset, Parsons sounds a theme that applies, just as well, to the present review:

It should be no surprise to those who know Tait's work that this is a very rich collection, with contributions on a wide variety of issues, both systematic and historical. That poses a problem for a reviewer, because a serious discussion of even all the major issues would be beyond the scope of a review. (p. 290)

It might be noted that Parsons' review essay comes to 30 pages. The themes that Parsons chooses to develop are Tait's views on the axiomatic method, showing how those differ from both the views of Gödel and Frege, Tait's well-known account of Hilbert's finitism, and Tait's views on other philosophers.

In our opinion, the main purpose of a review is to help the reader decide whether to obtain and study the item being reviewed. As should be clear from our summaries, our view is that unless the reader is already familiar with the full range and depth of Parsons' work, there is much to be gained from this collection.