Philosophy of Science after Feminism

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Janet A. Kourany, Philosophy of Science after Feminism, Oxford University Press, 2010, 149pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199732616.

Reviewed by John Forge, Sydney University


Janet Kourany believes that philosophers of science should be mobilised to support socially responsible science (SRS). She introduces the idea of SRS with reference to issues that concern women, issues that have, in particular, to do with women (still) lacking equal status with men. She begins her opening chapter with four quotations from international bodies such as UNICEF which cite facts about lower wages for women, preference for male children in many countries and violence against women. The next sections mention some scientific research that actually perpetuates sexual inequality and discrimination; for instance psychological research findings that see differences in male and female brains which implies that the latter are 'inferior'. Kourany then asks whether something should be done about this. Surely we can all agree that something should indeed be done, for presumably the research she mentions is bad in the sense that the findings are wrong, and we can all agree that one of the aims of science is to correct or reject bad work. Such corrective endeavours would therefore tend to help women by showing that they should not be denied equal status because, for instance, their brains differ from men's. Kourany then writes,

the above [issues] have analogues that pertain to race and ethnicity, sexual orientation, physical disability, and other struggles for social justice. Science can be a powerful ally in these struggles too, and in these struggles, too, science has all too frequently done more for the cause of inequality than for equality (p. 14).

It is these issues that characterise SRS.

The book is about philosophy of science after feminism, for not only should philosophers of science rally to the feminist cause, they should also concern themselves with these broader social issues. I am not convinced, by any means, by everything Kourany has to say about philosophy of science and SRS (and, some of the time, by the way she says it, and I have in mind here her penchant for sentences without verbs!). However, Kourany and I are very much on the same side when it comes to the need for science -- all of science, both pure and applied -- to be directed as much as possible for the benefit of people and society and away from special interests, and in urging philosophers, and others who study science, to support this agenda. Our differences are really only about the details. Moreover, I think Kourany would acknowledge that she has a pretty big agenda and that this book is only a beginning. She covers a good deal of ground fairly quickly, and it is clear that more needs to be said about many of the topics raised. In this sense, then, the book is somewhat programmatic and should be read as such. The big questions addressed in the book include the following: Why is it that philosophers of science have (tended to) neglect matters that have to do with socially responsible science, feminist critiques of science, and such like? (Why, in other words, is philosophy of science what it is today?) What can feminist studies offer by way of changing the direction of philosophy of science or of offering new directions? What are the challenges to this new way of doing philosophy of science and how are these challenges to be dealt with? And finally, what are the prospects for this new kind of philosophy of science? These big questions correspond to the four chapters in the book following the introduction.

Turning to the first big question, Kourany gives a synopsis of developments in philosophy of science since the professionalisation of the subject, which she dates from the middle of the last century. She traces the traditional concerns with issues such as theory structure, confirmation, explanation, and so forth to the influence of the Vienna Circle and to Hans Reichenbach's distinction between the contexts of discovery and justification. It is clear that if one is not interested in considerations that led scientists to do certain kinds of research and come up with certain discoveries, then one will not be interested in those scientists concerned with or motivated by SRS. However, Kourany points out that at least some of the members of the Vienna Circle were interested in social and political matters and that these concerns were lost when influential members transplanted themselves to the United States. But, as most of us who worked in the field know, the fact that logical empiricism was not a success did not mean philosophers of science decided that what had gone wrong was a failure to contextualise science. Some claimed to pay attention to the history of science, but Imre Lakatos, notoriously, thought it required rational reconstruction. Others looked to more effective methods of analysis, such as informal set-theoretical methods after the fashion of Patrick Suppes. For my own part, for what it's worth, I have recently given up my (thirty-year) subscriptions to Philosophy Of Science and British Journal for the Philosophy of Science because of the increasing specialisation of the discipline: I am not a philosopher of biology, though I find it interesting when I can understand it, and philosophy of physics is now just too technical, and there is little else in these journals. I wish there was, and I hope philosophers of science will become engaged with SRS, but I think they will not only have to change their ways, but acquire new means to do so (more on this point later).

The next chapter, Chapter 3, called "What Feminist Science Studies can Offer", I found to be the least satisfactory in the book. This is not because it was not a good idea to include a chapter of this sort -- indeed one of the key ideas of the book is that philosophers of science should follow the lead of feminists who have already sought to contextualise science, and, moreover, Kourany has defined SRS as a broadening of the feminist project to include social justice for all. The problem I have with the chapter is that it engages in a discussion of Helen Longino and others that seems a little too detailed and critical for the purpose for which it is intended, and I think this is because the chapter has appeared elsewhere and in a different context. If (possibly recalcitrant) philosophers of science are to be persuaded to follow the lead of the feminist philosophers, I think it would have been better to give a more general overview of the work. This could have been done keeping the (laudable) overall objective of the chapter which is to show that the ideal of SRS is a good candidate to replace the ideal of a value-free science. I have to say that Kourany's presentation of this option (pp. 67-77), in the form of a kind of debate, could have been a little better.

The following chapter, "Challenges from Every Direction", addresses a variety of challenges to SRS, and it is very well done. The challenges are five-fold: epistemological, historical, social, economic, and political. What are these challenges to, exactly? It is to any kind of interference in science and any attempt to direct science. For instance, Michael Polanyi remarked that "you can kill or mutilate scientific advance, but you cannot shape it" (Kourany considers this as part of the epistemological challenge to science, though I think, like much else, it was in fact a political challenge, designed to keep scientists in command of their own research agenda.) I think the simplest response to those who say that science cannot be directed or shaped is to say that nearly all of it is shaped and directed. The real challenge is changing the direction, away from projects that involve things like weapons research and development which absorbs by far the largest proportion of the R&D budget, to SRS-type projects.

One can go a step further and explain why science is directed and shaped by adopting Kuhn's account of normal scientific research. Kourany mentions this alternative, but does not finally commit herself (I would be happy to do so). The historical challenge, as Kourany understands this, can be disposed of quickly. She considers here Lysenkoism and Nazi science. The latter was essentially a curtailing of science, of branding certain sorts of physics 'non-Aryan', while the former was a distortion of the content of science. One can, of course, be a realist about science, think that science aims to describe the world as accurately as possible, and still believe that science should be socially responsible. That just means that one tries to describe those things in the world that assist socially responsible projects. Thus, we can all condemn Lysenkoism and Aryan Physics. Kourany then considers that if science had simply been left alone to get on with what it does best, we would not have had these distortions of science, and she introduces her discussion here of the sociological challenge with mention of the Mertonian norms. But these were supposed to regulate the scientific community considered as a kind of autonomous system whose aim was to produce 'certified knowledge'. So while this maybe insulated science against Lysenkoism and other distortions, there was no guarantee, or motivation, to produce anything socially useful. And, as Kourany correctly points out, Merton was surely painting an idealised picture of science. There is much other good sense and critique in this chapter.

Now to the final chapter, "The Prospects for Philosophy of Science in the Twenty-First Century". Having done the hard work in showing that SRS is not something that is impossible or contrary to the 'essential nature of science' or distortive of scientific advance, we come to the positive side, what philosophers of science should be doing. There are two related areas of new work that Kourany suggests. The first is to analyse, criticise and clarify the professional and ethical codes of conduct of professional scientific bodies, such as the American Physical Society, the American Chemical Society, and so on. The second is to help clarify science's research goals in the light of these values and (I assume) in view of the overall aim of SRS. As to the first of these new areas, Kourany states that this is the business of philosophers of science because it is a normative project and philosophers of science "have deep grounding in normative issues" (p. 118). I'm not quite convinced that philosophers of science have all the skills needed to work in this area, because I believe a fair amount of familiarity with moral philosophy is also needed. A moral or ethical code of science that goes beyond the requirement to uphold some self-serving set of institutional values will express moral values, and I am not convinced that philosophers of science have, on the whole, a deep grounding in moral issues. So I think that this endeavour is more inter-disciplinary than Kourany suggests, and to the extent that the task of clarifying research goals involves the application of moral values so it too will need more than the traditional skills of the philosopher of science.

The very last section of the chapter, Kourany's final thoughts, is about public intellectuals and why philosophy of science has produced next to none. The obvious answer is that they have nothing much to say to the public about the things that the public is concerned about. I agree with Kourany that they should engage with matters that concern the public, matters to do with equality and social justice, with misuse of research funds on war and weapons research, on health programmes for the benefit of rich white folks, and so forth. All of us in the field should take what Kourany says seriously and do our best to take part in the kinds of work she identifies in her excellent book.