Philosophy of Science Matters: The Philosophy of Peter Achinstein

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Gregory J. Morgan (ed.), Philosophy of Science Matters: The Philosophy of Peter Achinstein, Oxford University Press, 2011, 300pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199738625

Reviewed by Jarrett Leplin, University of North Carolina, Greensboro


This volume of essays related to the work of Peter Achinstein is overdue, and philosophers of science will benefit from its clarification of the many issues Achinstein has raised for the discipline. I will divide these into three main themes: evidence, induction, and realism.

Several contributors argue that Achinstein's conditions for evidence are too strong. Achinstein acknowledges weak senses of 'evidence', a sense that is subjective, depending on what one takes to be evidence, a sense relative to one's epistemic situation ("ES evidence"), depending on one's beliefs and inferential capacities, and a sense in which evidence is only potential because it might turn out false. However, real evidence, evidence of the sort that scientists want and that scientists intend when they make evidential claims, must be true, must epistemically justify believing what it is evidence for, and must with high probability bear an explanatory connection to what it justifies. This is "veridical" evidence, and it breaks with past philosophical theories in two ways. It is completely objective, independent of what anyone actually believes or knows. And it is empirical; the fact that an evidential relation holds is an empirical fact that cannot be determined a priori.

Achinstein's critics agree with these claims and so credit him with an important advance over the logical empiricist tradition. They balk at the abstraction of the veridical ideal from real epistemic contexts. This reluctance seems only reasonable. Since Achinstein is a scientific realist, one would expect him to endorse much of our present epistemic context and to be willing to relativize evidence to that. But he contends that if the inference from empirical information e to hypothesis H turns out to be incorrect, as it did in his seminal example of Hertz's work on cathode rays, then e was never evidence in the first place, however justifiedly it was taken to be. (Real) evidence cannot be false or misleading, even if trusting it involves no problem in reasoning. Instead, taking e to be evidence can just be bad luck, in the way that taking a justified belief to be knowledge can be bad luck.

Moreover, treating evidence like knowledge invites the objection that there is no analogue against evidence to the historical induction against scientific knowledge. We normally assume that there is knowledge even if we are unable to refute skepticism. We cannot similarly assume that there is evidence, for although there are no good arguments that skeptical scenarios obtain, there are good arguments against assuming that any of our science is true. In his reply to Stathis Psillos, Achinstein simply dismisses the induction because the fate of historical theories bears no explanatory connection to evidence for current theory, as his analysis of evidence requires, an answer that presupposes that his requirement is correct. He gives the same answer to Michael Ruse's claim that artificial selection is evidence for natural selection.

It is reasonable to ask why Achinstein thinks his is the concept that operates in science, and to suspect that the issue is to some extent semantic. If we have ES evidence and truth, why do we need another concept? Helen Longino, Philip Kitcher, Gerald Doppelt, and Kent Staley think we don't. Any talk of evidence depends on assumptions allowable in context, and an acontextual notion cannot get off the ground. Achinstein short-circuits much of this criticism by distinguishing an epistemic from an ontological claim. Evidential judgments are contextual and relative, but the claim itself is not. Moreover, since the evidential relation is empirical such judgments are not the business of philosophy.

It is remarkable that Achinstein is so widely misunderstood on this point. I think the reason is that he aspires to make a contribution of use to scientists and a concept whose applicability cannot be assessed makes no contribution. Commentators have supposed that he intended to be identifying what needs to be done to determine evidential status, not just what scientists mean by evidence, for that would be a substantive contribution.

Still, the reader will feel in most cases that Achinstein has the better of the exchange. An ironic exception is the reply to Richard Richards. Richards uses the distinctions among concepts of evidence to sort out a supposed puzzle in Darwin's thinking. Darwin is said to contradict himself on the issue of whether taxonomic facts, absent the mechanism of natural selection, justify believing in branching evolution. But a careful reading of Darwin dispels the alleged mystery, for the passage taken to deny justification grants that the belief is well founded. Darwin thinks that there is real but inconclusive evidence. This Achinstein cannot allow. Since evidence justifies belief one cannot have too little of it; once a belief is justified who needs more? Achinstein is mistaken in agreeing with Richards that Darwin is using evidence in his different senses.

Another exception is Larry Laudan's charge of circularity against Achinstein's argument for the improbability of the assumptions made by particle physicists in nineteenth-century debates over the composition of light. The argument depends on crediting positive instances of a hypothesis with evidential force, which Achinstein's eliminitivist methodology disallows.

If ES evidence is the right concept for science one would expect some explication of it. Achinstein relies on a presupposed, unexplained concept of epistemic justification. Kitcher attempts an eliminativist explication of ES evidence and Staley attempts to explicate it as the result of attempts to eliminate error scenarios. Justification for the claim that e is evidence for H accrues by identifying scenarios so far consistent with one's evidential situation but in which e would not be evidence for H, and acquiring evidence that these scenarios do not arise. This presupposes the notion of evidence. It assumes that e would not be evidence for H if e turned out to be false, which condition might be defensible in the context of veridical evidence but does not seem right for ES evidence. And it seems backward. If the way you get justification for the evidential claim is to eliminate these scenarios then you do not have justification to begin with. Yet you are supposed to have inferred H from e. If this inference is not justificatory why make it? If it is, then what is the explication of that form of justification?

What Staley wants is for the evidential claim to start out somewhat justified in one's ES with the justification then getting improved by exploring ways of going wrong. But what is the initial justification? What is justificatory inference? It can't be what Staley says, that the evidential claim is true relative to one's initial, unimproved ES, because if this condition is satisfied it follows trivially that the claim remains true in every scenario consistent with one's initial ES. It makes no sense to explore the error scenarios unless one's initial ES leaves the falsity of the claim open. The notion we need initially is that of justification, not truth.

Even if we had this missing explication, Achinstein argues that it would be of no use; there is no reason to care whether the evidential relation holds in an ES. What matters is whether it holds tout court; what matters is veridical evidence. But this makes sense because whether H holds in ES matters only insofar as we are justified in believing ES. So we fall back again on the unexplicated concept of justification.

Achinstein also assumes an only partially explicated notion of explanation. He has much to say about explanatory relevance and the pragmatics of explanation, but all of it depends on first understanding the explanatory relation. On this point Nancy Cartwright rises to his defense. We know explanation when we see it, and when we do not see it where we expect to the reasons are empirical, just as Achinstein says.

The Mayo-Achinstein exchange is a nice addition to the severe test vs. epistemic probabilist debate. Deborah Mayo shows that a hypothesis that passes severe tests, tests that it would be unlikely to pass if false, may nevertheless fail Achinstein's requirements for evidence, because its (objective) prior probability is low. Conversely, hypotheses that do qualify as evidence for Achinstein need not have been severely tested. In Mayo's examples it is supposed to be intuitive that we should qualify as evidence the data that severely tested H but not the data that yields high probability without severity. Achinstein constructs an example that is supposed to generate opposing intuitions: data should not be taken as evidence for H despite having severely tested H.

The problem is that intuitions may be diverging over an ambiguity in their talk of evidence. Achinsteinian evidence justifies belief and passing severe tests may not justify belief. For Mayo evidence means passing a severe test, but it is unclear what epistemic attitude this is supposed to warrant. If the right attitude is some degree of confidence short of belief, then of course Mayo's conditions for evidence will differ from Achinstein's.

Achinsteinian evidence requires an objective, context-independent explanatory connection between e and H, and Achinstein says that while the evaluation of explanations is pragmatic and contextual their correctness is not. An explanation correct in any context is correct in all, but better in some than others. But how bad can it be without losing explanatory status? Does the inebriation of the pilot of the rescue helicopter explain why the soldier died if the context is an autopsy? In causal explanation is the distinction between causes and mere enabling conditions contextual and if so how contextual is it? That is, how much variation is there, and are there context-independent factors that affect this variation? Achinstein thinks that being one or the other, a cause or an enabling condition, is context-independent, but which of these two alternatives holds is contextual, subject only to pragmatics. James Woodward argues that classification as cause or enabling condition, causal selection, is strongly, though not conclusively, influenced by stability and specificity, which are objective. Hence there is less contextuality to causal selection than Achinstein (or Mill or David Lewis) thinks. But Achinstein thinks that there are unstable causes, like the pill that has a side effect under unstable conditions.

Several contributions focus on Achinstein's defense of induction, which is grounded in probabilistic reconstructions of the methodological reasoning of Mill and Newton as against that of Whewell. Frederick Kronz claims that the methods are complimentary, and that apparent historical differences are matters of emphasis. But of course this depends on how one understands inductivism. If it is simply a method there is no incompatibility. One could both induce hypotheses via the causal inductive sort of reasoning that Newton uses to get gravity, and infer hypotheses from their explanatory and problem-solving virtues as Whewell advises. But Achinstein defends inductivism as a claim about what it takes to justify hypotheses. This is again an example of a dispute that looks semantic.

Another debate pits John Norton's contention that induction is entirely empirical and contextual against Achinstein's defense of a role for universal rules, like Newton's. Again, it is not quite clear what is at stake. They agree that it is an empirical matter whether an induction is epistemically justified, that an inductive inference exhibits a certain formal structure is never enough. But Achinstein contends that exhibiting some preferred formal structure is a necessary condition for justification. Norton evidently disagrees, because he claims that any universal rule is false if not qualified to the point of vacuity. But he also defends inductive principles where empirical facts warrant. He is happy to induce in quantum mechanics because the theory supplies facts, objective chances, that ground induction. So we can be "very sure" that a radioactive atom will decay over many half-lives. But what pattern is the induction supposed to follow? He describes it as an inference from past to future based on high probability, but this mixes up different principles. Either he is inferring a hypothesis from its high probability, in which case he has lottery problems, or he is inferring that the hypothesis is highly probable, in which case he is deducing. Given laws of quantum mechanics as empirical premises there is in neither case a need to project from past to future. For Achinstein's part, the claim that fitting an acceptable formal structure is a necessary condition of justificatory induction suggests that he regards induction as at least partly a priori, which would be a difficult position to uphold against Norton's examples.

Scientific realism is the issue in the contributions of Psillos and Bas van Fraassen. Van Fraassen claims that the evidence realists take to support the truth of atomic theory is only empirical grounding. It speaks not to truth but to the satisfaction of the empiricist requirement that values for significant theoretical parameters be calculable by applying theoretical assumptions to measurable quantities. The presuppositional role of these assumptions makes any realist inference circular. Achinstein defends his realism by pointing out that atomic theorists defended these assumptions independently. As he makes no case for the sufficiency of the defense, his point must be that the scientists in question had a realist agenda, contrary to van Fraassens's empiricist interpretation of their reasoning. Of course, this changes the subject. But van Fraassen and his critics have always differed over the proper formulation of the realist thesis.

Other contributors are Stephen Gimbel, Jeffrey Maynes, Jordi Cat, Victor Di Fate, Adam Goldstein, and Gregory Morgan, who further address the themes above