Philosophy of Science Today

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Clark, Peter and Hawley, Katherine (eds.), Philosophy of Science Today, Oxford University Press, 2003, 299pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199250553.

Reviewed by Peter Lipton, Cambridge University


The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science opened shop in 1950. To celebrate its 50th anniversary Peter Clark, the current editor, commissioned eight articles for a special issue (Vol. 51, 2000). He and Katherine Hawley, the Journal’s deputy editor, subsequently produced the book under review by commissioning four additional articles and adding an informative introduction and a nicely articulated index.

The thirteen articles are overviews, mostly of topics in the philosophy of science but sometimes of topics in general philosophy of particular relevance to the philosophy of science. Four focus on the philosophy of physics: Gordon Belot on relationism and the principle of relativity, Jeffrey Bub on the transition from classical to quantum mechanics, Nick Huggett on quantum field theories, and Lawrence Sklar on statistical mechanics. Sklar also focuses on the general question of what it means to give a philosophical interpretation of a scientific theory, a topic we will return to below. Stewart Shapiro writes about mathematics, Robert Brandon and Alex Rosenberg about biology. There are three articles on the structures of scientific inquiry: Kevin Kelly on induction, Stathis Psillos on scientific realism, and Noretta Koertge on constructivism, feminism and postmodernism. The three remaining essays are on general philosophy: Adam Morton on recent epistemology, John Campbell on the philosophy of mind, and Ned Hall and Laurie Paul on causation.

The quality of the contributors to this collection is high, and so is the quality of their contributions. It is not easy to write a really good overview, requiring as it does high levels of both informativeness and accessibility. Campbell, Hall and Paul, Psillos, Shapiro, and Sklar did exceptionally well in meeting this double-barrelled challenge, and almost all the contributors do a good job. Although the range of material covered by the volume is impressively broad, there is considerable philosophy of science that enjoys scant representation. As the editors note, there is little here that relates specifically to cognitive science or to chemistry; but nor is there much engagement with semantics, with ethics and public policy, with technology, or with substantive work in the social history of science.

Although only Sklar’s article has a sustained discussion of the question of the relationship between science and the philosophy of science, the collection as a whole naturally raises it. One bluff but tempting answer is that just as astronomers study the galaxies, philosophers of science study the astronomers. That is, the scientists and the science are simply what the philosophy of science is about. What does this answer leave out?

For one thing, the astronomical model of the philosophy of science does not intimate that the philosophical study of science is in some sense less empirical than the astronomical study of galaxies. But I want to focus on another striking and, it must be said, intentional omission. That is prescription. Astronomy is a worthwhile activity even though it does not aspire to improve galactic behavior. Similarly, the philosophy of science is a defensible activity even if it aspires only to understand and not also to improve scientific behavior. Some scientists miss this point, supposing that philosophy of science could only be worthwhile if it made for better science. This attitude is understandable but it is also somewhat odd, given that many of these scientists are happy to justify their own research in wholly non-instrumental terms.

Of course there are prescriptive philosophers of science. Karl Popper is an obvious example and it is this aspect of his work that primarily explains his popularity among scientists, at least among those who have time for any philosopher. At the same time, Popper’s deductivism seems to most philosophers fundamentally flawed. The cost of his brave attempt to stand up to the problem of induction by doing without any notion of non-demonstrative support entails a profound scepticism, in which there can be no reason to believe any empirical claim, or even to believe that one claim is likely to be closer to the truth than another. Scientists, however, tend not to be so sensitive to this depressing feature of Popper’s view, and they seem to find his exhortations to negative evidence genuinely helpful.

Generally speaking, however, it is just as well that the intellectual justification of the philosophy of science does not depend on the practical value of its methodological prescriptions. The most impressive thing about our models of epistemic practice is their inadequacy. We know all is not well when one of the major challenges facing our work is to find a way to prevent one’s favourite model from entailing that every observation would be evidence for every hypothesis. Nor is it surprising that our models should provide only crude representations of what is actually going on in scientific communities, given how complex are their actual practices. But this does not bode well for a program of methodological prescription. Moreover, even if the philosophical models were to become far more accurate and articulated, they would probably be in the wrong form to provide substantial help to practicing scientists. As Thomas Kuhn emphasised, although scientists often act as if they are following a methodological rule-book, the book does not exist. Instead scientists learn by example and are guided by perceived but inarticulate similarities between the exemplars and new cases. Most scientific cognition is tacit, and this helps to explain why it is so difficult to generate explicit and accurate models; it also helps to explain why, even if we could generate such models, they might not be all that useful to the practicing scientist.

Methodological advice is not however the only type of prescriptive philosophy of science possible, and the other types do show some of the limitations of the non-interventionist astronomer model. Current work in biomedical ethics and in science policy are obvious examples. Interestingly, although the forward to the premier issue of The British Journal of the Philosophy of Science (vol. 1, 1950) includes a promise that the Journal ’will seek to further no cause other than that of general enlightenment’, it goes on to make the following appeal to the scientists:

We appeal to them to supplement the prosecution of their particular and limited tasks by reflection on the meaning of the great movement of which they form a part and by the study of its actual and possible effects on the future of both the individual and society. In their hands lies a power of which they are as yet imperfectly aware but which, consciously or unconsciously, they will use to shape the pattern of life in the days that lie ahead. Only by a determined effort to understand the powers and the limitations and the essential character of the Science of which, without such an effort, they will become the slaves and not the masters, will they succeed in turning their opportunity to good account.

But although the Journal did go on to publish some material with a methodologically prescriptive flavour – including a number of articles by Popper – there seems very little if anything on ’the possible effects on the future of both the individual and society’ in the first fifty years, or in the present collection.

There is however a third form that prescription from philosophers of science may take, different both from methodological advice and from ethical guidance. The philosophical work may impinge directly on the content of a particular scientific theory. This form of philosophical intervention enjoys a treatment in one of the most stimulating articles in the collection, in Sklar’s development of his conception of what it is to give a philosophical interpretation of a foundational theory in physics. According to him, the dilemma to be avoided is between a wholesale naturalism that leaves no role for a distinctively philosophical contribution to science and the mere imposition of prior metaphysical commitments onto science. Such an imposition is not real interpretation, but only MIMO (Metaphysics In, Metaphysics Out), where the prestige of the scientific theory is used to give false credit to the metaphysical input.

The key to avoiding this dilemma, according to Sklar, is to see how interpretive problems are posed by anomalies or puzzles that are internal to scientific theory. To be sure, most scientific anomalies do not have this power to push beyond the direct scientific practice itself. Instead, they prompt either the adjustment of auxiliary assumptions or the rejection and replacement of theory, both activities that remain internal to the scientific practice. But there is a third and special class of anomaly that does prompt philosophical interpretation and sometimes philosophical intervention. According to Sklar, these interpretive anomalies take many different forms. The theory in question may be the best on offer, but it may also generate gross errors in prediction, lack mathematical rigor, reach too far above its empirical base, deploy inappropriate concepts, generate infinities or singularities, or fail to fit properly with other theories with which it ought to have intimate relations.

This list of anomalies that may prompt and support philosophical interpretation is diverse. Here Sklar recalls Tolstoy’s remark that ’all happy families resemble one another, but each unhappy family is unhappy in its own way’. The list given of interpretive responses to anomaly is diverse as well, though here it can be roughly organised in order of increasing intervention. At the weakest, interpretation may consist in an attempt to provide a philosophical reconceptualisation of the concepts and assertions of the theory that generate the anomaly, without any change in the theory itself. Second the theory may be reformulated. Third, an interpretation can attempt to show that a concept that seems to come from outside the theory (e.g. ’measurement’) can be re-construed from within the conceptual resources of the theory itself. A fourth and substantially more disruptive form of interpretation is to attempt to produce an alternative theory that is in some sense empirically equivalent to the original but avoids its unattractive metaphysical or mathematical features. Finally, an interpretation may suggest ’adding new theories to science’ and may involve new ontological commitments. Interpretive difficulties internal to the science may thus lead to the deepest reaches of metaphysics, influencing our views on such subjects as the nature of the beginning of the universe or the nature of time asymmetry in causation and in explanation. And here there is genuine interaction between the science and the philosophy: the scientific anomaly influences the philosophy, and the philosophical interpretation influences the science.

Sklar illustrates his account with brief reference to various foundational theories – including Newtonian dynamics, special and general relativity, quantum mechanics, and quantum field theory – mentioning the anomalies and some of the interpretative solutions on offer. (Some of these are explored in more detail in the articles by Belot, Bub, and Huggett.) Sklar also provides a more extended discussion of the interpretive issues in statistical mechanics. The primary purpose of his paper, however, is to advertise the metaphilosophical project of articulating the structures of the philosophical interpretations of scientific theories.

Sklar’s discussion is at once plausible and provocative, suggesting many questions, of which I can only mention two here. First, how does Sklarian interpretation relate to naturalism? Sklar finds a tension insofar as the naturalist insists that science must be the sole judge of its own products, that philosophy cannot be prior to science. But it is not clear that Sklar’s account really does conflict with this Quinean picture (a picture well-presented in Shapiro’s article), since it would seem that all the naturalist needs to do to make interpretation kosher is to call Sklar and his co-workers scientists. Nor would this be an arbitrary change of job-description, from a Quinean point of view, especially in light of Sklar’s emphasis on the role of scientific anomaly in interpretive work. Nevertheless, there is an important change of perspective here. For where Quine encourages us to draw our metaphysics and epistemology from the successes of our best science, Sklar encourages us rather to focus on where our best science is in trouble. And where the Quinean influence is from the science onto the philosophy, Sklar countenances the influence running the other way, with the philosophy playing a role in changing the science. This is certainly different from what Sklar refers to as ’quietist naturalism’, though it does not appear to require a notion of the philosophical a priori outside Quine’s web of belief.

The other and related question is why it should be important that the philosophical work should flow from scientific anomaly, rather than other and more successful features of the theory. I think one of the reasons Sklar emphasises the negative is that it provides a kind of answer to the MIMO worry. Insofar as a philosophical interpretation solves a genuine scientific puzzle, the charge that one is merely imposing prior metaphysical prejudice onto a scientific theory can be answered, and by solving the puzzle, one is given a genuine reason to believe the philosophical claims required in the solution. The anomaly-resolution model of philosophical interpretation is also natural because so much philosophical activity is driven by puzzles, so the model fits into a broader conception of the epistemology of philosophy. At the same time, however, and as this volume illustrates, most philosophy of science does in fact draw on the positive content of our best scientific theories and upon exemplary scientific practices, rather than upon the weak points of science, and to use such success stories to defend a philosophical claim need involve no pernicious circularity.

Sklar’s account of interpretation highlights an important weakness of the astronomical model of the philosophy of science. It is true that astronomers study the galaxies and that philosophers of science study the astronomers. But the astronomers generate theories, and theories are different from the galaxies they may explain. For galaxies are never wrong and never suffer anomalies. That is why prescriptive philosophy of science makes sense in a way that prescriptive astronomy does not. Still, as the present volume well shows, a great deal of the best philosophy of science proceeds without prescriptive aspirations, so it is just as well that the discipline could certainly justify itself if it could provide as much illumination of the behavior of scientists as astronomers provide illumination of the behaviour of galaxies.