Philosophy of the Social Sciences: Philosophical Theory and Scientific Practice

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C. Mantzavinos, Philosophy of the Social Sciences: Philosophical Theory and Scientific Practice, Cambridge UP, 2009, 333pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521739061.

Reviewed by Warren Schmaus, Illinois Institute of Technology



Chrysostomas Mantzavinos’s goal in this anthology is to make the philosophy of the social sciences more responsive to actual work in the social sciences. Some of the contributors to this volume, such as Nancy Cartwright and Daniel Little, indeed further this end. Cartwright brings philosophical methods of analysis to bear on the inferences for public policy that are drawn from the results of randomized controlled trials in the social sciences. From ongoing social science research programs in the United States, Little extracts a philosophy that emphasizes the explanation of complex social phenomena over the search for universal laws. However, Mantzavinos’s overall agenda is largely set by philosophy. The first section of the book is devoted to questions of social ontology, the second to laws and explanation in the social sciences, and the third to examples of how philosophy and the social sciences can fruitfully interact. The main contributions are all by philosophers. Each essay is followed by a commentary, most of which are by social scientists. There is more concern with exploring such traditional philosophical problems as reductionism and the nature of joint action than on analyzing actual working methods, theories, and research programs in the social sciences.

The social scientists writing for the anthology represent the disciplines concerned with explaining choice and action, such as economics, political science, sociology, and psychology. Disciplines such as anthropology or history that are also interested in explaining culture and tradition are not represented. This is rather odd, since there is even a molecular biologist among the commentators. Mantzavinos’s preferences no doubt reflect his professional interests, as he holds a joint appointment in economics and philosophy at Witten/Herdecke University. Problems in the philosophy of the social sciences concerning such things as functional explanation and the nature of culture are overlooked. There is nothing on the history of philosophical problems in the social sciences or on feminist contributions to the social sciences. Finally, there is little on ethical issues in the social sciences, e.g., issues concernrf with research involving human subjects. The audience appears to be researchers and upper-level graduate students, as many of the chapters presuppose a familiarity with the philosophical literature.

In the first section of the book, John Searle, Michael Bratman, and Philip Pettit rehearse positions already familiar to philosophers. Pettit’s chapter on the reality of group agents may be the clearest and most persuasive. He articulates a set of conditions for agency, including not acting at random, resilience, and variability in the realization of goals. Then he characterizes a voting pattern for an assembly that would allow it to satisfy his definition of an agent. Diego Rios, the commentator, appears to be convinced by his argument.

Searle’s chapter is based on his 1995 book, The Construction of Social Reality. He defends two claims here. The first is that political and social theorists take language too much for granted. Social contract theorists, for example, assume the contractors already have a language. But once there is a language, Searle argues, there is already at least an implicit contract. This is a plausible thesis, but it appears to have more to do with social and political philosophy than with social science. Mark Turner supports Searle’s position and adds that there are other cognitive activities in addition to use of language that social theorists appear to take for granted. As Turner puts it, human beings are “built” for social life, for instance in the way our perceptual apparatus carves up experience into events involving agents acting on objects. Our sense of personal identity is another example. The social sciences that are especially vulnerable to taking this for granted are those that deal with such things as rational choices and preferences. Turner finds “homo economicus” in particular to be little more than a folk theory of a rational agent.

Searle’s second claim is that a certain class of social facts — what he calls “institutional facts” — depend on language. Given his concept of an institutional fact, the second claim comes close to tautology. Searle speculates that the system of commitments we make with one another arose first through the development of language and that these commitments were then “easily” and “inevitably” extended to create other social or institutional facts such as private property and marriage. However, he concedes that he knows of no society with no other institutional facts beyond language, which should give him pause. One could, after all, argue instead that commitments such as pair-bonding existed well before language and that once language evolved, it simply allowed these commitments to be expressed explicitly, critically examined, and refined.

I find myself much in agreement with Pierre Demeulenaere’s critique of Bratman’s chapter on shared agency. Through an analysis of joint action, Bratman attempts to build up shared intention from individual intentions without introducing anything irreducibly social. Demeulenaere points out that Bratman’s account rests on metaphors such as “emergence” and “levels” that are not clear. Even the concept of “social” is not well-defined. He agrees with Bratman that ultimately only individuals act. However, Demeulenaere rejects the opposition between the individual and the social and argues that all action, including the philosophers’ stock example of two people travelling together, takes place in a social setting against a background of social norms that allow it. Even what social scientists take to be individual preferences are rooted in social norms.

Questions of social ontology cannot be settled solely through a philosophical analysis of intentional action. Answers to such questions depend on whether the social phenomena that our best social science theories can explain can also be explained solely by individual psychology, without postulating any kind of social entity. Thus, for instance, Durkheim argued that it is unlikely that individual psychology alone could explain such things as social suicide rates and crime rates. One could of course argue that Durkheim’s sociological theories are no longer generally accepted and that indeed there is no consensus in the social sciences regarding what is the best explanation for any set of social facts. Nevertheless, many would agree that socially variable facts such as murder rates cannot be explained in terms of individual or shared intentions.

David Papineau begins the second section on laws and explanation by investigating the implications of physicalism for the question of the autonomy of the human sciences. He considers the possibility of selectionist laws analogous to those in biology that do not reduce to the laws of physics, but worries whether these are genuine laws in which natural kinds figure. Robert G. Shulman, the sole biologist to contribute to this volume, and Ian Shapiro, a political scientist, point out that reductionism is a philosopher’s worry and that Papineau overestimates the extent to which reduction has been achieved in the natural sciences. They argue that that reduction is not only irrelevant as a goal to working scientists but inimical to progress in neuroscience, psychology, and the social sciences.

Sandra Mitchell questions whether the philosopher’s explanatory ideal of universal, exceptionless, and necessary laws is realized in any discipline. She argues that even the laws of physics are contingent upon conditions that obtained in the first few minutes of the universe. In her alternative view of knowledge, there is a continuous range of contingency and stability in our explanatory laws. James Alt faults Mitchell for not providing a way to measure these degrees of stability and contingency, but he is generally supportive of her position and even finds that it agrees with the way in which theoretical models interact with empirical research in political science.

As I mentioned earlier, Little articulates what he perceives to be the guiding philosophy behind contemporary work in the social sciences in the United States. As he understands it, American social science research is not engaged in the search for universal laws modeled on those of the natural sciences. Nor does it seek to make predictions. Rather, it emphasizes the historical and cultural variability and contingency of social phenomena and postulates a variety of causal mechanisms and social processes to explain them. Little then defends a view he calls “methodological localism.” Like methodological individualism, it holds that social facts, causes, and structures are ontologically dependent on individuals. But unlike methodological individualism, methodological localism insists that individuals are socially situated or constituted, that is, that they cannot be characterized independently of social factors such as the beliefs and norms that they have acquired through their interaction with institutions and other individuals. The causal mechanisms that explain social phenomena operate through these individuals. Methodological localism is concerned with the causal mechanisms and pathways that can explain individual outcomes or sets of outcomes. Little casts doubt on the search for theories that are generalizable over societies. He finds no reason to think that a mechanism that is discovered in one set of circumstances will produce the “same” effect in a similar set of circumstances. Social causal mechanisms will combine with each other as well as interact with initial conditions to produce their effects. Jack Knight reads Little as making the empirical claim that social conditions are too complex to allow for generalizations, a claim that he finds open to testing. He defends a middle ground between searching for universal theories and merely describing individual cases, one that seeks causal mechanisms that can be found in a variety of situations. In the end, Knight’s position is not all that far from Little’s.

Cartwright has similar concerns about social causation. She argues that the causal efficacy established in randomized controlled trials (RCTs) is not a reliable guide to the effectiveness of the cause in field applications. This is not simply a problem of generalizing from one case to another, but of inferring from a certain kind of population, experimental set-up, and set of conditions to a completely different kind of population and set of conditions. She cites the example of RCTs conducted in Tennessee that showed that academic performance improved with smaller class size. When they attempted to apply this result in California, it created a demand for more teachers and less qualified ones were hired, especially in the schools with the most disadvantaged students. Although RCTs may be able to measure how much efficacy a cause has, or what Cartwright calls the “capacity” of a cause, in questions of social policy one may not be able to simply add up the contributions each cause will make to the total effect in the way that, say, we add vectors in physics. We lack an adequate social theory that can tell us how to combine social causes or even whether it is possible to study each cause acting separately and then combine their effects in some way. Although Gerd Gigerenzer respects and agrees with Cartwright’s analysis, he makes a good case that more, not less, attention needs to paid to the results of RCTs in setting public policy. Drawing on the example of policies for breast cancer screening in Germany and the US, he argues that here the evidence from RCTs has been ignored, suppressed, and deliberately misrepresented.

The third section provides three examples of how philosophy and the social sciences could enrich each other. In the first, James Woodward draws on results from experimental economics to address the question of why it is that people cooperate as much as they do. He finds both conceptual and empirical problems with the standard view that explains cooperation in terms of an equilibrium reached in a repeated game played by self-interested players. Experimental results are better explained by a model that includes different sorts of players, including some who are not solely motivated by maximizing their individual pay-offs. Woodward also maintains that an adequate model of cooperative behavior must take into account the fact that actors need to share some background information, supplied by social norms and institutions, in order to be able to predict each other’s behavior. He then raises the question of whether these social norms and institutions can be explained by individual preferences. Since preferences reflect social norms, he finds that there is no non-circular way to do this.

Woodward’s argument may be persuasive as far as it goes, but philosophers should probe more deeply. As his chapter follows closely after Cartwright’s, one is led to wonder whether there may be a problem with drawing inferences from laboratory games that is similar to the problem she points out with drawing inferences from RCTs. That is, can we infer anything about cooperation in real life from results obtained under the context-free laboratory conditions under which prisoner’s dilemma games, ultimatum games, or public goods games are usually conducted? To be fair, Woodward also discusses research in which some of these games have been tried with people from other cultures. He reports that the degree to which people cooperate in one-shot games has a lot to do with the basic form of economic life in their societies. For example, the Lamerela, a whaling society from Indonesia, are more cooperative in games than the Machiguenga of Peru, among whom economic life centers on the family farm. This is explained by the fact that successful whaling involves a higher degree of cooperation than farming. However, once anthropologists have explained these different forms of social cooperation in terms of their relationships to economic life, what is the point of bringing these laboratory exercises out into the field?

Woodward argues that to the extent behavior in laboratory games is affected by norms, we should expect some correspondence between such behavior and behavior in the field. But this looks like using fieldwork to explain the experimental results, rather than the other way around. Werner Güth and Hartmut Kliemt rightly criticize Woodward’s discussions of cross-cultural comparisons as unsystematic and anecdotal. Perhaps because they are economists, they do not take the next step and ask whether experimental economics is the best approach to explaining cooperation. Once we admit that cooperation depends on social norms and institutions, it would make sense to turn to anthropology and history — the neglected disciplines in this volume — for explanations of the varying degrees of cooperation in different cultures and societies.

In the second example, Ernest Sosa defends virtue theory in psychology and ethics against situationist arguments raised by philosophers such as Gilbert Harmann and John Doris. These critics have argued that there is insufficient evidence that differences in human behavior can be explained in terms of differences in character traits and that behavioral differences are to be explained in terms of differences of situation. In support of their arguments, they point to the Milgram experiment, in which subjects were encouraged to engage in behavior that seemed to cause others pain, and the Good Samaritan experiment, in which the degree to which subjects helped others depended on how much they had been told to hurry.

Sosa distinguishes the explanation of behavior from the explanation of variation in behavior and says that virtue theory never claims that differences in behavior are to be explained in terms of differences in virtue. Virtue theorists have argued that situationists are attacking a crude, behaviorist version of virtue theory that does not make room for deliberation about goals, desires, and motivations. The world is a complicated place and deliberation is not easy. Good traits like honesty can come in degrees, much like physical dispositions such as fragility, and yet play a role in the explanation of behavior. A person may be honest enough in making change but not in filling out her taxes. Sosa draws an analogy between virtue and driving competence. A person may be a competent driver in rural areas but not in congested cities or during inclement weather. But the fact that a person’s ability to drive may vary with situation does not entail that we should not try to teach people to be good drivers. Similarly, the fact that behavior varies with situation does not entail that we should not try to instill virtue in people. Sosa also questions whether situationism is all that different from virtue theory, since situationists must appeal to dispositions as well as situations in order to explain behavior, and dispositions are not all that different than virtues.

Steven Lukes agrees with many of Sosa’s critiques of situationism and also thinks that the conflict between situationists and virtue theorists may be only apparent. However, he finds competence in driving somewhat disanalogous with virtue, since virtues depend on context and point of view. For example, what is loyalty to one person may be nepotism to another. Lukes also makes the excellent point that theorists should consider not only the results of social psychological research such as the Milgram or Good Samaritan experiments, but the historical record of actual social experiments in the twentieth century. This history shows how the virtue of ordinary people may collapse under extreme circumstances. But it also demonstrates that some behavior may be explained only in terms of individual virtue or character, such as the behavior of those who rescued Jewish victims of the Holocaust.

The third and final example of fruitful interaction between philosophy and the social sciences concerns the problem of the hermeneutic circle, that is, that the meanings of parts and whole are interdependent. Mantzavinos argues that this problem cannot be used as an argument for the autonomy of the social and human sciences relative to the natural sciences. As he sees it, it is neither an ontological nor a logical problem. It is not even the methodological problem of how we are able test interpretations. Rather, it is an empirical problem for psycholinguistics, concerning how the mind of the interpreter is able to generate interpretations. Mantzavinos argues that linguistic understanding is a skill upon which we can improve until we reach the point where generating interpretations becomes automatic, something that does not require conscious attention. Empirical studies show that people slow down when they reach unfamiliar words, which he takes as evidence that they are having trouble generating interpretations. Perhaps. But I am not so sure that it is easy to separate the generating from the testing of hypothetical interpretations.

David-Hillel Ruben focuses more on explaining social facts than on interpreting texts, but thinks both tasks raise similar issues. He argues that holism and circularity are not the same thing, as circularity entails return to a starting point. However, if we assume that earlier things explain later things, there is a problem with the end point explaining the starting point. An example of an explanatory circle might be how wage increases explain inflation which explains wage increases, but in this case the latter would be a second round of wage increases at a later time. Ruben ultimately concludes that for a hermeneutic circle to exist in the social sciences, there would have to be a demonstration that no social facts can ever be explained in terms of non-social facts. But he knows of no such demonstration.

In his epilogue, Mantzavinos says that philosophy of the social sciences should play a normative role, productively criticizing theoretical developments and scientific practices in the social sciences. I can only agree and insist that philosophy must be engaged with the social sciences to a much greater degree than it has been in this volume. Philosophy of the social sciences should not be encumbered by a philosophical agenda inherited from the philosophy of the natural sciences. Philosophers need to focus their critical attention instead on problems that arise from research in the social sciences. Some of the social scientists who contributed to this volume could have been more hard-hitting in their critiques of philosophers, pointing out where they have not met their obligations to contend with real problems in the social sciences.