Philosophy of Time and Perceptual Experience

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Sean Enda Power, Philosophy of Time and Perceptual Experience, Routledge, 2018, 249 pp., $140.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780815370383.

Reviewed by Carlos Montemayor, San Francisco State University


Power defies the limits of space -- measured in printed characters per page -- in his book on the philosophy of time and perceptual experience. Almost every issue in metaphysics and epistemology conceivably related to the topics of time, space and perception receives commentary. The diversity of topics addressed is matched only by the array of wide-ranging and perplexing claims concerning the nature of space and time; the nature of perceptual experiences -- not only in relation to the nature of space and time, but also in general; the errors of hallucination and illusion; naïve realism, as the central view discussed in the philosophy of perception, by assumption and without much argumentation. Nor does the author omit the phenomenology of perception, memory (including the nature of memory as an extension of perception), experienced time, perceptual justification or perceptual judgment.

The book is structured as follows. An introduction laying out the theoretical commitments and main claims of each chapter is followed by a cursory presentation of the main issues in the metaphysics of time (chapters 1-2). The next seven chapters (3-9) concern perceptual experience. More specifically, they discuss the structure of perceptual experience and the errors of perception, explaining why one should adopt theories that produce fewer errors: a combination of naïve realism and eternalism is assumed as the best combination (chapters 3-5). Three chapters about space follow, one as a relation to the past (6) and two about experiences and distortions of depth (7-8). Chapter 9 provides a superficial and peculiar survey of the main views on the experience of time. Chapter 10 culminates with the startling claim that hallucinations can be eliminated by adopting a B-theoretical perspective in combination with some imprecise commitments concerning the nature of perceptual experience. A substantial amount of my attention focuses on this claim about hallucinations, because it seems to be the main thesis the author intends to defend -- although even this is unclear.

Power says that hallucinations are forms of anosognosia (lack of knowledge, typically of an actual disorder or malfunction), though this flies in the face of commonsense. How, then, does he propose to "turn" hallucinations into anosognosia? He recurs several times to an example concerning purple spots that might be gremlins (pp. 1, 8, 224, 236). It was never clear to me what exactly this perceptual experience was supposed to be about -- what this experience seemed to be about -- or even what exactly the point of the example is. It seems, at least in the original presentation (p. 1) to be about judging the visual experiences caused by whacking one's head, rather than a genuine case of having a perceptual experience with gremlin-content. What ensues is the narration of an argument between Power and his brother. When Power abruptly hits his head, his brother offers a malicious interpretation: the dots he experiences are gremlins. Power says there is not enough evidence for this (presumably the judgment, based on the experience), but the status of the dots as appearances is very much up for grabs. Are they real, or are they hallucinations, illusions or afterimages?

Power argues that, because of such cases, it is best to eradicate any possibility that they might be hallucinations by considering them a case of anosognosia: there appear to be no gremlins; but the spots are there, Naïve realism is satisfied by default and a B-theoretic framework is used to explain other cases in which there seems to be no duration or no spatial distance, or no property being instantiated, but in which they are all there. The problem really is that we are anosognostic in cases of perceptual error. But if that is the case, then why not affirm that one sees gremlins instead of spots? Wouldn't that be a case of gremlin anosognosia? Power writes:

To take these experiences exactly as I describe them is a commitment to an ontology that many may find to be too much, including myself. I consider it too much to commit to the existence of gremlins. So how can I explain my experiences in a way that is compatible with naïve realism? The way to do so is to analyse these experiences in terms of anosognostic errors.  . . .  One assumes that gremlins are creatures with malicious intentions. All these spots indicate is that they are in motion. There is nothing obviously malicious or even intentional about that. More proof is needed to show that these spots are gremlins (which even then I knew of course -- but had no desire whatsoever for any further proof). (pp. 236-237)

The conclusion of this passage is that the purple spots are indeed there, at a certain distance, and that they are not hallucinations because they are a form of delayed perception. This experience, according to Power, is quite limited and undetailed, it is "a kind of 'squinting' within my perceptual faculties when looking at the world, or like having somewhat bad hearing" (pp. 237-238). So, are the spots there or not? A decisive answer is critical for both the naïve realist and the eternalist, but since these are cases of bad perception, it is unclear that either will be enthusiastic. One way or another, arriving at a verdict here deserves a lot more argumentation and careful assessment of epistemic issues than Power provides. He surmises that the importance of the question he has in mind is enough to make his approach a serious account of perceptual experience: "The central question to take away from this work for any other area of research is this: Given some entity you posit as existing, how does it exist and how is it structured in time? If that is an important question, then this book has argued that how one answers it can depend on one's position in time" (p. 236).

This is the type of argumentation that Power deploys throughout the book. Claims about perceptual experience are said to depend on highly theoretical ontological commitments, but it is never clear how the epistemic or metaphysical claims should be evaluated. Why should an experience that Power compares to bad hearing be considered a case of veridical perception that confirms both naïve realism and eternalism? Nowhere can one find a sustained discussion of what Power means by epistemic justification or of how exactly his fanciful scenarios should be understood. The only place in the book where he sheds some light on this critical issue is in the first footnote. He says that perceptual experiences need to be trustworthy, and distinguishes trustworthiness from reliability by claiming that reliability can go wrong and that he is interested in something that cannot go wrong. He then defines trustworthiness as follows: "An experience of E is trustworthy if, given the experience of E, then E" (p. 19). This seems to be the view called "phenomenal conservatism" (more about this below). Yet, Power does not discuss it further, in the context of naïve realism and eternalism, relegating this important issue to a footnote, as a kind of afterthought.

About the anosognostic proposal, one wonders what Power thinks about standard anosognosia, in which patients deny that they have a mental disorder. Is standard anosognosia also a kind of naïve realism-perception in which subjects are awkwardly positioned in spacetime (of the B-theoretic kind) and therefore, nothing is really quite wrong with them (or their preferred ontology)? Can we really extend Power's account of perceptual error to cases of mental disorders? He seems to think we could, which shows that there is very little by way of principled constraint on his account. The notion of "experience" needs to be defined in a much more regimented way in order to parse good and bad cases, to avoid skepticism, and to make sense of our perceptual capacities.

In that spirit, let us consider a more standard case concerning the justificatory role of perceptual experience. Suppose you look outside your window and see a squirrel. To you, the way the squirrel looks, given your surroundings, eliminates many possibilities in a non-lucky, immediate, and powerful way. You are pretty sure it is a squirrel. You believe your eyes, and confidently affirm that there is a squirrel outside. But, as we all know, there might be defeaters. You might be tired, you might be drunk, it might be dark outside, or you are in fake-squirrel country. These are standard, run of the mill defeaters -- the apparent squirrel might in fact be a small cat, or even a well disguised drone. Moreover, there might be a more troubling, more difficult to identify, kind of defeater, one that might not be available for conscious assessment, but which somehow depends on your character and background information (Siegel, 2017). These are central issues in the epistemology of perception.

However, if Power is right, there might be an extraordinary type of epistemic justifier of experience dependent upon the very nature of time itself (notably, Power's avowed definition of "trustworthiness" does not include this commitment). This basis for perceptual experience needs empirical verification from physics. Unlike the a priori claim concerning phenomenal conservatism, the ultimate basis for perceptual justification rests on an empirical issue concerning the nature of time. Although physicists struggle to account for the nature of time, spacetime is critical with respect to whether you should believe your eyes or not. But, as mentioned, Power says that one can eliminate hallucinations by appealing to his eternalist account. Go figure.

There are, of course, reasons to suspect that our perceptual experiences are not trustworthy. In order to resist skepticism one needs an epistemic theory, rather than speculations about spacetime. Grounding epistemic justification in how things appear, absent defeaters (Huemer, 2007), is a standard response to skepticism. But this seems impossible on Power's view because such grounding depends on the truth of a highly theoretical account of time. In fact, it is not even clear what justificatory role appearances play, given that hallucinations are conceived as a form of ignorance combined with something that really "is there." This tension between basic epistemic justification and an extravagant kind of B-theoretic justification of all appearances permeates the book. A fundamental problem is that Power's view seems to get rid of defeaters by turning hallucinations into forms of anosognosia. But no theory of perceptual experience makes sense without a treatment of epistemic defeaters. Appeals to the nature of spacetime will not help here.

What requires explanation concerning time perception? Presumably the experience of time -- the commonsensical, believe your eyes, type of appearance. Not so, according to Power. Astonishingly, he admits on page 229 that although "a tenseless theory ontology captures the phenomenology of perceptual experience better than a tensed or presentist ontology" there is one exception: the passage of time. How exactly, then, can a tenseless view capture the phenomenology of perceptual experience if temporal passage is unaccounted for? Doesn't time seem to pass and doesn't perception seem to be framed within time's passage? Further explanation is required. Instead, one encounters dogmatic statements that since eternalism and naïve realism are true, then this consequence must be accepted, in spite of flagrant inconsistencies. If one focuses on how things appear, this analysis (if one is willing to call it an analysis) gets things entirely backwards. Callender (2008), who offers an empirically grounded B-theoretic explanation of the phenomenon of passage, admits that the way things appear seems to favor the tensed view of time (or A-theory). It is, therefore, very difficult to understand what Power has in mind here.

Before learning truths about tenseless time, and before thinking about ontology, we would surely have to begin with some basic perceptual experiences that have at least some justificatory status, in order to avoid rampant skepticism. Zimmermann (2008, 222) addresses this issue and shows how it favors presentism. Absent very powerful considerations, he argues, one must believe what is patently obvious, the most commonsensical and experientially basic truths that ground our actions and plans. Otherwise we cannot get a hold on which perceptual beliefs must be accepted. And this, Zimmerman says, shows that the A-theory must be the default view unless we have very strong reasons to reject it, because it is supported by experience. This is the standard way to proceed, from perceptual justification to theoretical truths. Power proceeds in the opposite direction, by assuming theoretical truths while also appealing to how things appear. However, unlike Zimmerman, Power never explains the relation between his unorthodox view and skepticism. Given the topics he covers, it is remarkable that Power does not discuss this argument by Zimmerman (and other presentists and A-theorists) on how presentism best accommodates appearances. It is equally remarkable that he omits views that might be more in line with the idea that past experiences are real (but inaccessible) and against the notion that the experience of passage supports the A-theory, such as Skow (2015).[1]

This is an audacious book. It provides, as I hope to have shown, an unbalanced approach to the many issues it covers. That time perception is related to the nature of time and that the phenomenology of experience is related to issues in the metaphysics of time are clear enough propositions to evaluate, although, contrary to Power's presentation, they are far from uncontroversial. Even if one were to accept the view that no thesis in the philosophy of perception and perceptual experience can be made without a clear commitment to the metaphysics of time, it remains unclear that one could conceive of perceptual experience in the way Power suggests.


Callender, C. (2008). The Common Now. Philosophical Issues, 18(1): 339-361.

Huemer, M. (2007). Compassionate Phenomenal Conservatism. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74, 30-55.

Siegel, S. (2017). The Rationality of Perception. Oxford University Press.

Skow, B. (2015). Objective Becoming. Oxford University Press.

Zimmerman, D. W. (2008). The privileged present: Defending an A-theory of time. In D. W. Zimmerman, T. Sider, J. Hawthorne (Eds.), Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics (pp. 211-225). Blackwell.


[1] Thanks to Meghan Sullivan for advice on this issue.