Philosophy Outside-In: A Critique of Academic Reason

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Christopher Norris, Philosophy Outside-In: A Critique of Academic Reason, Edinburgh University Press, 2013, 252pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748684557.

Reviewed by John McCumber, UCLA


It is increasingly clear that many philosophers have come to think, to paraphrase Wittgenstein, that "the limits of my specialty mean the limits of my world." For Christopher Norris, these philosophers have locked themselves into an isolated philosophical Kuhnianism, which polices away everything revolutionary and makes their inquiries "'normal' to the point of stagnation" (1). In spite of its veneer of "properly scientific method" (3), philosophy has thus locked out an essential feature of science -- the creative, venturesome side that deals in presuppositions too basic to be either logically derivable or empirically confirmable, and which has played important roles in many major scientific advances (5-7). Ironically, this aspect of scientific work used to be carried out by philosophers. Now that they have abandoned it, scientists themselves have taken it over. They are prone, alas, to do it badly (5).

Norris hardly thinks that the remedy is philosophers' unlocking their disciplinary doors and running free, à la Rorty, into the buzzing (but not blooming) confusion we find today in all too many corners of academia (15-18). The real problem is not to nourish speculation, which we will have always with us, but to distinguish between its component of "pure fabulation" and the "empirically informed rational conjecture" that both philosophy and science need. Loose in this "shadowy border zone" (13), philosophers are best equipped with a number of tried-and-true allegiances: to a realism which includes bivalence, a "robustly specified concept of natural kinds" and their constitutive properties or "essences," causal explanation, and inference to the best explanation (7-9).

These allegiances are not uncontroversial, to say the least, but Norris' aim here, except in Chapter One, is not to defend them; he has done that elsewhere. Nor does he rely on them at every point in this diverse and fascinating book. When it comes to prising philosophers out of their stagnant normality, any lever will do.

Or levers. Norris seeks to build what we might call a variety of micro-bridges among various contemporary philosophical discourses, showing how they would profit from at least a minimal appreciation of larger horizons. The choice of these discourses is inevitably, to some degree, a personal one. The book thus constitutes what he calls "a sequence of essays in philosophy that are also essays in diverse topics which, for various mainly non-professional reasons, have come to exert a special interest or fascination" (2).

Of special interest to Norris are, first of all, two general topics: the debate between realism and anti-realism (Chapter One) and the risk of monumental error run in all "great philosophy" (Chapter Two). There follow discussions of more specific matters: experimental philosophy (Chapter Three), the extended mind thesis (Chapter Four), the ontology of political song (Chapter Five), speculative realism (Chapter Six), and certain mysteries about the philosophical reception of Shakespeare and Derrida (Chapter Seven).

As can only be expected in such an idiosyncratic collection, some essays are more illuminating than others; but all, I have found, can be read with profit. Much of the profit lies in the way Norris cuts these specialized discourses away from their self-protective minutiae and paints, with a broad brush, pictures of how certain representatives and positions within them can look to someone outside the field. Like murine endocrinologists and ideal magnetohydrodynamicists, many philosophers today are not used to that kind of scrutiny. It is they who ought to find this book particularly illuminating, if often exasperating. Someone who is looking for a neutral and comprehensive introduction to its many topics, however, had better keep on looking, for Norris' various discussions presuppose a good deal of background.

The first chapter provides a good example of the strengths, and the weaknesses, of Norris' approach. It is addressed to an ancient dilemma: either a "realist" view that truth is human-independent in such a way that there are truths that can hold whether we have discovered them or not, or the "anti-realist" claim that the concept of truth has to be reduced to "the best of our capacity for discovering, ascertaining, inferring, proving or deducing the truth-claim in question" (34). The anti-realist side has come to set the terms for the debate; but it is only there in the first place because it seems promising as against the even-less palatable road of skepticism: truth-by-our-current-epistemic-lights is better than no truth at all (53).

But not for Norris. "Whole-hog" anti-realism, like skepticism, conflicts with our "basic belief" that scientific progress comes about "through a truth-conducive or truth-approximative movement of thought whereby knowledge replaces an earlier stage of ignorance or manages to close the gap between truth and what previously counted as truth, according to the verdict of educated opinion" (35). So in recent debates anti-realism is given only highly qualified formulations -- while realism, too fearful of skeptical challenges, "dare[s] not quite speak its name" (36). The result is a discursive field in which fudges look like advances. Thus, Crispin Wright's concept of "cognitive command" is basically realist, but beset with clauses that disguise the fact (41-45). Still, Wright is in a much better position than Michael Dummett, whose anti-realism focuses too tightly on mathematics and fails to account, again, for the realist-oriented progress of science in general (44).

Chief among the strengths of Norris' overall approach here (and throughout the book) is that he does not take the realist-anti-realist debate on its own terms. Instead of simply opting for one of the available positions and criticizing the others, he asks after the shape of the field as a whole and after the forces producing that shape. (The main force in this case is the prominence of anti-realism, which encourages the fudges and perversities he has examined.)

Norris' discussions of individual thinkers are thus designed not merely to state and evaluate their positions, but to show how the underlying forces he has identified are shaping them. This enables him to dispense with the "epicyclic complexities" to which they have given rise, and which are identifiable as such once the underlying pull has been located. The result is not free from what may look to insiders like oversimplification and distortion, but these are actually helpful to Norris' project. Philosophers, like everyone else, have an obligation to understand how their thought looks to people outside its field. If, as here, certain factors shaping the field make its inhabitants look bad, that needs to be reflected upon.

The main problems are with presentation. This chapter (like the rest of the book) reads as if quickly written. This may be an effect of the (entirely laudable) passion with which Norris writes it; but it makes his discussion hard to follow. Repetitions and a style often more peppy than precise make his underlying points harder to grasp. Thus, the possibility that the distinction between realism and anti-realism is really just a matter of temperament is given sudden discussions on page 47; why just there is unexplained. The multiple discussions of Kant as the philosophical grandfather of anti-realism (37-38, 49-50, 54-55) serve no discernible purpose, and the interjection that the whole debate would have been more salutary if it had paid more attention to continental philosophy is nowhere justified by a statement of just what such philosophy might bring.

The latter is particularly damaging because one continental thinker whose views Norris never mentions had a lot to say about truth: Hegel. Hegel is a strong believer, of course, in progress, scientific and other; but he is not wedded to the idea that progress must be viewed as an approximation to truth. Any scientific theory, or, indeed, any kind of human enterprise, begins with implicit or explicit claims about what it is supposed to do. These claims can amount to anything from truth to mere pragmatic acceptability; the point is that they are made, or implied, by the theory itself, and so furnish criteria by which it can be judged. Science progresses when a theory is unable to meet its own standards for success. Overall commitments to notions like truth are thus unnecessary.

The subsequent chapters can be discussed more briefly.

Chapter Two explores one of the dangers in going beyond normal discourse: that one may get things horribly wrong. The best guard against this is to combine "speculative boldness" (69) with "formal precision and logical rigour" (68). With analytical philosophy folded into torpor, Norris finds this combination most clearly evidenced in Alain Badiou and Jacques Derrida (69). Much of the essay is devoted to a useful summary of Badiou's account of set theory as ontology, which brings mathematics and politics into unexpected mutual proximity (80) -- though Badiou's founding identification of set theory with ontology (80) has a good chance, in this reviewer's opinion, of counting as horribly wrong.

The corresponding discussion of Derrida is postponed until the book's final chapter, which looks at Samuel Johnson's and Ludwig Wittgenstein's animadversions on Shakespeare and sees them as provoked by the same things as provoked the later, much nastier bellowing about Derrida from the precincts of philosophical Anglosaxony. This is the very combination of acuteness and creativity that Norris has been advocating all along. If Shakespeare had been any less cognizant of human affairs, or Derrida any less analytically scrupulous in teasing out the hidden paradoxes in canonical texts, neither would provoke the negative reactions both in fact did. Wittgenstein stands in the middle of all this, and so tests the limit of Norris' own analysis: he himself has the same combination of boldness and rigor that bothers him in Shakespeare.

Chapter Three argues that the debate between thought-experimentalists and experimentalists -- between those who, from their armchairs, believe that philosophy has methodological resources and problems of its own, and whose who think philosophers are cognitively unprivileged and must consult outsiders (99) -- is entirely specious. The experimentalists do not really deny philosophical expertise, but displace it onto their experimental subjects (102-103), whom they require to be good reasoners in the usual philosophical way (105); while thought-experimentalists, if they wish to be plausible at all, must view their armchair constructions, not as the exercise of some "mysterious 'intuitive faculty'" (103), but as modal reasoning from counterfactual premises, a skill shared across humanity (101).

The two positions only seem antagonistic if we assume that philosophy must either be apodictic or empirical, and that dichotomy is part of philosophy's unfortunate heritage of Cartesian-Kantian dualism (113). The thought-experimentalists plump, let us say, for the Kantian transcendental, while the experimentalists go for the empirical. They then try to make their very similar positions sound as different from one another as possible.

That same dualist heritage is also responsible for the current, sad shape of the extended mind debate. On one side we have the hypothesis that certain technological contrivances should be counted as components of the minds of those who use them. Against this, Norris places Jerry Fodor's view of "underived content" (itself derived from John Searle), which maintains that there is an undeniable (if not easily formulable) distinction between the "sui generis" contents of our minds, which are about other things and so intentional, and the deliverances of external technologies, which become intentional only when made so by a mind (124-127).

This debate, unlike the previous one, is real enough -- indeed, it "has some large ethical and social implications" -- but is likely to end, not in victory for either side, but simply in boredom (135). The villain is once again the heritage of Descartes: the Fodorian view is formulated around (though not within) the terms of Cartesian mind, while the extended mind is thought of on analogies to Cartesian matter (136).

The extended mind writers do import, however, one unfortunate feature of the Cartesian mind: its isolation from other people. They give little more than lip service to the idea that cognition can be socially, as well as technologically, extended (135-136). Were they to explore it, they would be able to draw a non-arbitrary line between contents intrinsic to the mind -- those which come from other people -- and contents which come from technological accessories (137, 139). Taking this seriously, however, would suggest a sustained engagement with continental thinkers (137) -- most obviously, though Norris again does not mention him, with Hegel.

Speculative realism is still too new and inchoate to have produced any real controversies; Norris' account of it in Chapter Six is more a book review of Quentin Meillassoux's After Finitude (Continuum, 2008). Norris acutely points out a massive contradiction between the book's first part, which argues from the case of fossils that there are facts about the universe independent of our minds (181), and its second, which argues that the laws of nature are merely one infinitesimal set of possible laws, any of which "could come into force from one millisecond to the next" (190-191). The latter view, unlike the former, is not realist because it renders scientific progress inexplicable: the persistence of natural laws long enough for scientists to find them can only be a sort of against-all-odds "singularity" (191).

The remaining chapter argues that we can best understand what political song is and how it works by turning (once again) to Badiou's ontology. It is hard enough to follow that I will forbear discussion of it, except to note that it might have been clearer if Norris had discussed in some detail any actual examples of political song.

Norris finds, in diverse current debates, two shaping forces: the ongoing influence of Descartes and Kant, and the persistent "Europhobia" of analytical philosophers, who avoid any position or topic (such as the socially extended mind suggested in Chapter Four) that might require them to engage with continental philosophy. These points are well taken, in spite of their sometimes infelicitous expression and the necessary oversimplifications of the positions discussed. They make this book an important, as well as a fascinating, one.

Norris stops short, however, before getting to the institutional forces responsible for these shaping forces, and in particular for the Europhobia. One of these is the education received by most mainstream analytical philosophers, which does not provide the background or tools they need to read and understand people like Hegel, Heidegger, Derrida, or Deleuze. It is unrealistic to expect someone caught in professional busyness to sit down and acquire those things, even if Norris is right (and he is) that doing so would lead to the better conduct of her own work. What Norris should really be pushing for, then, is a revamping of philosophical education in the English speaking world. Absent that, I fear that what his bridges really show us is the darkness at the end of a steadily-narrowing tunnel.