Philosophy, Sophistry, Antiphilosophy: Badiou's Dispute with Lyotard

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Matthew R. McLennan, Philosophy, Sophistry, Antiphilosophy: Badiou's Dispute with Lyotard, Bloomsbury, 2015, 150pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472574169.

Reviewed by James Williams, Deakin University


They say too many books are written. I'm not so sure. So long as a book is read by someone at some time. Even if it is not read, like a redemptive private diary which never goes beyond a locked drawer, the process of writing can be enough. I am sure that some books need to be written. Academia is a propitious place for them because the quest for explanations and knowledge replaces faulty descriptions, corrects arguments and fills gaps in understanding. It does not matter how vast the fault or small the breach, when a book serves to remedy them, it was needed.

This book was necessary. It is the first book on the encounters, disputes, agreements and commentaries bringing Jean-François Lyotard and Alain Badiou together. Over many years, they shared roles as activists, influential writers and teachers. The contrasts and overlaps of their works allow for a more subtle understanding of their philosophies, not only as related yet at times opposed positions, but also independently, as two of the most significant combinations of ontological and political engagement in recent philosophy.

It is a responsibility to write a necessary book. Unlike works of fiction, where failure is hard to categorise and predict, academic research goes wrong in very precise and well-known ways. It might fail in its scholarship and thereby misrepresent its topic. It might bring together all the right materials but add nothing to the evidence it collects, leaving the reader with the frustrating thought that it would have been better to have read the originals, even only a portion of them. Or the book might offer implausible explanations and tendentious knowledge, thereby betraying the uninitiated and infuriating the well-informed.

In writing an original, carefully researched and enlightening commentary on the connections  between Badiou and Lyotard, Matthew R. McLennan has avoided these pitfalls. Firstly, he is meticulous in tracking the many moments and details of the debates. His book is a thorough and accurate resource. Secondly, he sets out the different arguments explaining why their philosophies can be drawn together, but ultimately how they differ at their most important points. Thirdly, and most originally, he sets these differences within a discussion of distinctions between philosophy as sophistry and philosophy as quest for truth.

Finally, McLennan takes up a position on these debates around the question of the future for philosophy under the ubiquitous form of capitalism we could describe as austerity capitalism, which, according to him, appears to have little demand for philosophy, other than as some kind of instruction in secondary skills: 'In sum, philosophy -- where tolerated -- is increasingly tapped for its productive potential rather than its millennia-old and, arguably, essential link to truths. In a general way, this poses with a new urgency the question of philosophy's survival.' (2) I will discuss each of these facets of the book, drawing out potential objections. None of these are fundamental, in the sense of uncovering major flaws in the argument. The point is instead to suggest alternative perspectives.

One of the difficulties in studying the connections between Lyotard and Badiou as an encounter or debate is that for a fairly obvious reason -- and for a more awkward one -- the main witness and contributor to the debates is Badiou. He has outlived most of his contemporaries from May '68 and after. He has also produced many commentaries on them; for instance, in his Pocket Pantheon with its essays on Lacan, Sartre, Lyotard, among many others.

The obvious reason is that, in living longer, Badiou has had more time to bring his thoughts to print. In this chronological sense, the last word belongs to him. The other explanation is more involved. I'll put it indelicately first, then track back to a more diplomatic version. Badiou is an unreliable witness. It is not that he tells untruths or has a bad memory, but rather that what he writes is first and foremost about Badiou's cause. He is not a chronicler or historian but rather a militant. Sometimes, reading him on others feels like being sat next to a bore at a party; the man who brings everything back to his successes and others shortcomings.

Here is an example of the problem, from the Pocket Pantheon's very beautiful and wide-ranging discussion of Lyotard:

Yes, there was a political gulf between us. And, then, for him, politics withdrew as the privileged site where the intractable manifested itself. For me, it was a truth-procedure that could be sequentially inferred from evental singularities; it was still there, and so was the factory. (109)

After paying a generous and moving tribute to their shared commitment to activism, among Renault workers at the Boulogne-Billancourt factory, Badiou describes this gulf as growing from Lyotard's and others critique of Maoism in the seventies, when Badiou remained a committed communist (he still is). According to Badiou, the divergence increased over the years, until Lyotard no longer saw politics as the main locus for an intractable event, that is, an event occurring beyond the resources of State and economic systems and demanding resistance to them.

However, as McLennan shows, in Lyotard's last major book, The Differend, a critique of capitalism and of the requirement to always 'save time' in any given process is a central part of Lyotard's argument. Furthermore, Lyotard never abandons politics. He redefines what the political is and how we can be political in our contemporary situation. This is as true of his late essays as it is of his early works: 'It is in the name of this figure of infancy that the later Lyotard militates, and resistance to its transformation or defeat by purely instrumental rationality is, for him, all that remains of politics.' (54) I take issue with the 'all that remains' since its rhetorical turn gives the impression of retrenchment and loss, but it could just as well be put as 'this is where politics can be renewed' or 'this becomes the touchstone of Lyotard's new politics'.

The crux of the matter is not a turn away from politics, as Badiou's version would have it. It is rather about what politics can be and the form politics should take. Badiou's militant approach, his commitment to a truth-procedure with uncompromising fidelity to the demands of an event, means that he cannot accept Lyotard's position as politics or the political. To do so would be to betray Badiou's convictions. He is not an egotistical bore; far from it, given the beautiful flourish of his style, once he moves away from his mathematical proofs. It is rather that he is more like a frighteningly steadfast neighbour at the dinner table. Darling, I don't think he is joking . . .

McLennan is very good at tracing Badiou's arguments, as set out in his early review of Lyotard's The Differend. Following Badiou's lead, McLennan divides the arguments into seven 'punctuations'. The seventh explains both why Badiou claims that Lyotard has abandoned politics, in Badiou's sense, and why Badiou thinks that he is wrong to have done so. The issue turns on different lessons to be drawn from the failure of state-based communism.

On the one hand, though Badiou acknowledges the failures of states claiming to be communist, he does not accept that these point to the end of communism. This is because the states failed communism rather than failed by correctly following communist hypotheses: 'The failures, being procedural, do not as such invalidate the [communist] hypothesis, so for Badiou the way forward is communist.' (64) On the other hand, Lyotard sees signs of terminal failure in names for the violent turn taken by communist states against their people -- names such as 'Czechoslovakia 68', the name for the invasion by the Soviet Union and other Warsaw Pact countries that crushed the Prague Spring. This leads to a move away from communist militancy: 'Lyotard's general drift to the lonely position from which truly inter-subjective moments occur only as inhuman resonances from which nothing, or at any rate no substantive 'we,' can be constructed.' (64)

In this summary of Lyotard's political position, I think McLennan overplays the negative side of the idea of the inhuman and underplays a new sense of collective in Lyotard's work. The inhuman serves as a critique of false claims to human universality. This allows for positive groups to be constructed, not around a universal concept of the human, but rather in more fluid and varied joint callings to do justice to particular irresolvable differences, as argued by Dylan Sawyer in his recent Lyotard, Literature and the Trauma of the differend. Sawyer sees greater political power in Lyotard's late works due to his focus on aesthetics, an area downplayed by McLennan in favour of the legal and Kantian sides of Lyotard's work.

For example, against the terrible suffering of migrant children, abused children and child labour, it is not obvious to me that a one-size-fits-all humanist defence of childhood would be superior to one based around more attentive descriptions of what's non-negotiable about each childhood, as precious and radical possibility of difference. This would be carried by the life of every child, as described in Lyotard's late essay on Arendt: 'Birth is not only the biological fact of appearing, but, under the cover and concealment of this fact, it is the event of a possible radical alteration in the course of things as they are pressed to repeat the same.' (1991, 70)

The third facet of McLennan's work is an analytical tool for understanding the deepest philosophical differences between Lyotard and Badiou. It is based on distinctions around the place of the sophist in philosophy. Badiou retains philosophy's commitment to unconditional truths. His fidelity to communist events chimes with the model for philosophy given by Plato against the sophists: 'we can get at the unconditional and preserve the category of truth'. (126)

For Badiou, the truth of equality still resounds and we can be faithful to it despite the violent collapse of historical communist states. Whereas Lyotard is sceptical about philosophy's claims to truth: 'Lyotard approaches philosophy as practice. He mines sophistical resources in thinking philosophically against a theoreticist conception of philosophy.' (72) Political commitment is replaced by an ethical responsibility not to cover the event of intractable difference with claims to adequate resolutions of that difference: 'To speak of the ethical is to speak of a bearing-witness and an obligation to the event.' (102)

This contrast leads to McLennan's position in the debate and to his indications for the future of ethically and politically motivated philosophy. He aims to bring Lyotard and Badiou together, but with an emphasis on Badiou's work, where commitment to truth is concerned. The importance of retaining both thinkers comes from the ethical restraint in Lyotard's work, despite Badiou's stronger defence of philosophy's desire for truth, revolt, logic, universality and risk (126): 'This note of caution is precisely the kind of contribution Lyotard -- playing the sophist, perhaps -- can make to Badiou's project.' (127)

I wonder whether we should reverse this emphasis. It seems to me that the risks of Badiou's philosophy might not be in the desire for truth but in the belief in it. The dangers are not in the revolt, but in the absolution from hesitation and restraint that follows from firm belief. Let's learn carefully from Badiou's spirit of revolt and desire for equality. It does not require ethical restraint from Lyotard, but rather an ontological modesty stemming from his aesthetic feel for the absence of secure being.


Alain Badiou (2009) Pocket Pantheon: Figures of Postwar Philosophy, Trans D. Macey, New York: Verso

Jean-François Lyotard (1988) The Differend: Phrases in Dispute, Trans. G. Van Den Abbeele, Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press

Jean-François Lyotard (1991) Lectures d'enfance, Paris: Galilée

Dylan Sawyer (2014) Lyotard, Literature and the Trauma of the differend, New York: Palgrave Macmillan