Pierre Bayle's Cartesian Metaphysics: Rediscovering Early Modern Philosophy

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Todd Ryan, Pierre Bayle's Cartesian Metaphysics: Rediscovering Early Modern Philosophy, Routledge, 2009, 223pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780415770187.

Reviewed by Thomas M. Lennon, The University of Western Ontario



Bayle poses special difficulties of interpretation. The principal difficulty lies less in the literal meaning of individual texts than in the overall account of what he actually believed and what he was trying to achieve. So great is the difficulty that some of us have taken to referring to the “Bayle enigma”. Was he a Christian believer? If so, of what sort? Was he a secret atheist? A mere skeptic? An existentialist? The list goes on. Ryan does not claim to have solved the enigma, but his book does have as its “principal aim … to provide the detailed analysis that might help lay the groundwork for resolving the Bayle enigma, [the] choice of topics being guided by the conviction that Bayle can be thought of as a Cartesian skeptic” (p.5).

Throughout, the theses of the book are clearly and cogently argued. Suppose, however, that Bayle eventually turns out to have been something other than a Cartesian skeptic, rejecting both skepticism and Cartesianism in favor, say, of Manicheism. Ryan’s book would still stand as a contribution, because the Cartesian views and the detailed arguments in favor of them are still there, and Ryan’s account of them would still show how they could have had the influence they did, both negative and positive, later on. In short, in uncovering the “philosophical presuppositions that drive [Bayle’s] interpretation and criticism”, what Ryan has undeniably given us is an indication of why Bayle should have come to be called the “Arsenal of the Enlightenment” (p.114).

But if the antecedent conviction that Bayle was in fact a Cartesian skeptic, which a priori is far from implausible, then it is to be regretted that, for limitations of space, Ryan set aside the topics of Zeno’s paradoxes of motion, animal consciousness, and the nature of time (preface). Perhaps a subsequent edition will include these and other topics. Of the book’s 227 pages, 160 are devoted to text, with an additional 47 pages of notes, mainly consisting of engagement with the literature, and reproductions of the original texts of which Ryan supplies the first translation. All the translations that I verified were done impeccably. The subtitle of the book is a bit mysterious, although there seem to me several senses in which it might be taken, successfully, as applying here.

Under the rubric of Bayle and Cartesianism, the first chapter deals with five topics, beginning with (1) the metaphysics of substance. After a clear account of Descartes on substance, mode, and attribute, there emerges a nice understanding of the issue of real qualities, necessary for any appreciation of the debate surrounding the scholastic doctrine of the Real Presence in the Eucharist based on transubstantiation. (2) Discussing the nature of body, Ryan shows how Bayle appealed to occasionalism to rebut the objection to the plenum from Locke and Newton that motion is possible only in a vacuum. God recreates the world from one indivisible moment to the next such that the moving parts of material rings successively occupy different places, but with no place ever left unoccupied. Also found here is a discussion of Bayle’s version of the labyrinth of the continuum, the trilemma of mathematical points, or physical points, or infinite divisibility. Ryan shows that, while Bayle sees all three as laden with difficulty, he relies on the last view as relatively more évident. Nevertheless he does not discuss how Bayle arrived at this perception. The point was of particular interest to me because Ryan sees his skeptical Cartesian reading of Bayle as “perhaps closest” to my own, with the difference that "évidence is not an absolute quality of beliefs, but one that admits of degrees" (p.5). (3) On the nature of the mind, Bayle’s assertion of the immateriality of thought is less than unequivocal, with the result that his was only a “mitigated assent to dualism”. This seems to me a serious limitation on his Cartesianism, since this doctrine was the only one to which all Cartesians subscribed. (4) Bayle agrees only with the causal component of Malebranche’s vision of all things in God because, for him, in order for ideas to have representational content, as Ryan calls it, they must be modes of the mind, and not exemplars in the mind of God. (5) On the other hand, Bayle agrees with Malebranche’s idea-sensation distinction, as well as his view that all pleasures make us happy for as long as we experience them. Ryan gives an especially insightful account of Bayle’s defense of Malebranche against Arnauld’s view that sensations are intrinsically representative (pp.29-31).

Mind-body dualism is treated in the second chapter. Bayle argues that because emergentism cannot be correct (only motion and shape can result from change in essentially extended material substance), either the soul is really distinct from the body or else all matter thinks. Another argument for dualism is the Achilles of Rationalist Arguments, made famous by Kant in Second Paralogism, but with a history back at least to Plotinus. The subject of a unity of consciousness (of the words of a single verse, for example) cannot be accounted for in terms of (infinitely) divisible material substance; hence the soul must be indivisible, i.e. simple and without parts. Bayle does not take the traditional further step of inferring the soul’s immortality from its simplicity, however. For this, the additional premise that thought is of the essence of mind would be required, from which our knowledge is blocked, as Malebranche showed, by our lack of an idea of the mind. Still, according to Ryan, it does not follow, as some have tried to argue, that Bayle thus leaves open the possibility of materialism.

The brief, third chapter on Bayle’s critique of Lockean superaddition is an exegetical tour de force with respect not only to Bayle but especially Locke. Much technical ink has been poured into the literature over Locke’s view that certain phenomena such as gravity were added by God to matter beyond what could be accounted for on the basis of (knowledge of) its essence alone. To get at Bayle’s critique of the view, we need the gem that Ryan supplies here, which is a brief, clear account of the view itself.

In particular, the possibility that God superadded thought to matter “fitly disposed” has drawn the attention of commentators from Leibniz to the present. Bayle was interested in this view because, as he saw it, the whole basis of rational theology, beginning with proofs for the existence of God and of the immortality of the soul, was thereby upset. Now, Bayle took the analysis of matter as res extensa, a thing extended in three dimensions, as fundamentally the most certain view of the Cartesians (p.15). Ryan here shows the importance of that doctrine in that Bayle ascribed it, mistakenly as it happens, to Locke in his arguments against the possibility of thinking matter. Bayle’s worry was that if thought can be superadded to matter, then thought is not incompatible with its essence and thus what God supplies could come from matter itself. Bayle came to realize that Locke in fact did not hold that extension is essential to matter, and thus his reliance on the Achilles against Locke, and even discussion of superaddition itself, disappear from Bayle’s critique of Locke. Instead, Bayle’s critique becomes the worry that Locke is unable to account even for the immateriality of God by way of contrast to the created world.

Like many others, Bayle took occasionalism to be Malebranche’s most important doctrine. Chapter four discusses the three arguments for the view that drew Bayle’s attention. (1) Although Bayle seems not to have advanced the argument from necessary connection, he did defend it against Fontenelle’s objection. If a real cause is defined as one necessarily connected to its effect, then extended bodies are real causes when they collide insofar as their nature as impenetrable necessarily determines God to resolve the outcome in only certain ways. Bayle’s reply is, in effect, to distinguish causal necessity from metaphysical necessity, a strategy that is successful only if occasionalism construes the necessary connection as a merely necessary condition rather than one that is sufficient too. (2) Bayle (like Hume) was very taken with the quod nescis argument that a real cause must know both its effect and how it is produced. Ryan nicely ties the argument as Malebranche deploys it to the issue of sighted agency, namely, the requirement that there can be no volition without ideas, and to the notion of natural law as the propositional content of a divine decree. Finally, (3) there is the argument from constant creation, that there is no real difference between conserving something, which God does for everything that exists, and (re-)creating it from moment to moment. Here the issue is whether Malebranche can move from the weak conservationist thesis that God is the real cause of the existence of all other substances to the stronger view of occasionalism that God is also the only real cause of all their qualities as well.

Ryan produces some very sophisticated pages in showing how Bayle extends and strengthens the strong version of occasionalism against possible objections to it. One might have wanted a bit more commentary on two counts, however. First, Bayle’s argument seems to rest on two principles that prima facie involve an inconsistency, or at least an equivocation, as Leibniz thought. Bayle’s argument for the strong conservation thesis that God is the only real cause both of substance and all its qualities

consists of two stages, each of which is based on a distinct causal principle. First, no creature can be a complete or even partial cause of its own existence at a given moment, since acting presupposes existence. But neither can a created substance be a real cause of its existence or accidents at some subsequent moment, since every effect must be simultaneous with its cause (p.84).

Second, Ryan shows how Bayle invokes an extreme nominalism by rejecting any real distinction between “ubification”, a thing’s being located in space with respect to other things in space, and the thing ubified. This seems to be a wider issue than just spatial relations, generally involving all modes. Locke, for example, was led by his extreme nominalism to regard all properties as essential properties.

According to Bayle, although occasionalism is the most defensible position on causation, there is a major objection to it, namely that it undoes human freedom and thus undermines moral responsibility. In fact according to Ryan, Bayle’s “aim is to establish the incompatibility of that doctrine [of continuous creation] with human freedom of indifference” (p.81). Bayle’s arguments to show that indifference is not revealed by Malebranchean inner sensation are rather beside the point, however, because Malebranche himself never opted for a human freedom of indifference. The upshot is that “reason is at a standstill concerning human free will”, presumably because there are rational grounds of at least some cogency supporting indifference (p.88). Although Ryan does not say so, the impasse must be resolved for Bayle by his fideism.

There were many points of actual exchange between Bayle and Leibniz, but the confrontation between them set up by Ryan is, by his own account, disappointing (p.113). Bayle’s defense of occasionalism against Leibniz’s criticism that it involved an appeal to a miracle that was no less miraculous for being constant rather missed the mark since his understanding of a miracle as contrary to natural law differed from Leibniz’s understanding of it as contrary to the nature of the thing involved. Meanwhile, Bayle’s attack on Leibniz’s doctrine of the pre-established harmony was similarly vitiated by his conception of substance as an ens per se, rather than the center of activity that underlay Leibniz’s conception. This dialogue of the deaf seems guaranteed by Ryan’s decision to focus on the issue of causation to the exclusion of the other of the two issues that they sought to debate, namely the problem of evil, Bayle’s treatment of which occasioned Leibniz’s famous theodicy.

The chapter on Spinoza is of particular interest. The article on Spinoza in Bayle’s Dictionary is longest of all, and it is clear that Spinoza held a unique fascination for him, even to the point of serving as an alter ego. Even so, Bayle is unrelentingly critical of Spinoza’s metaphysics, especially of what he called the “abominable hypothesis” that there is but one substance, which is God. Bayle’s actual arguments against this pantheistic substance monism have not been taken very seriously by commentators, however, and a great virtue of Ryan’s book is to demonstrate that "Bayle’s reading of Book I of the Ethics shows a good deal more subtlety than has been commonly allowed" (p.136).

Ryan distinguishes five objections in Bayle’s treatment of Spinoza: (1) the argument from compositeness of extension: substance monism is incompatible with substance having extension as an attribute, which consists of real parts, which are beings per se and as such substances themselves; (2) the argument from incompatible properties that the single substance would have; (3) the argument from mutability that follows from the separability of the parts of extension; (4) the argument from the identity of attributes based on the real identity of attributes with substance; (5) the argument from divine goodness that God as the only subject of predication would be the author of evil, would struggle against himself, etc.

A final chapter shows the use to which Bayle puts the doctrine of continuous creation in dealing with the metaphysical problems of motion within the rather crude version of mechanism to which Bayle appeals. Even so, that version of mechanism has its limits according to Bayle, since to account for the formation and development of living things, even Malebranche’s preformationism is insufficient, and immaterial, intelligent forces, beyond even Cudworth’s plastic natures, must be invoked.

The chapter and the book come to an end with a judicious discussion of the contest Bayle poses between Christian theism and Stratonian atheism, both of which he sees as beset with rationally ineliminable objections, the problem of evil and the inconceivability of creation against the former, and the violation of the quod nescis principle and the inexplicability of any principle of self-motion against the latter. Ryan begs off any further investigation due to the “extraordinarily interpretive question of Bayle’s ultimate attitude toward atheism and fideism” (p.158).