Place, Commonality and Judgment: Continental Philosophy and the Ancient Greeks

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Andrew Benjamin, Place, Commonality and Judgment: Continental Philosophy and the Ancient Greeks, Continuum, 2010, 186pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441176806.

Reviewed by Brent Adkins, Roanoke College


What is the relation between violence and the political? Is the political inherently violent? Does every founding political act require violence, such that violence and the political are inseparable? The dominant trend in recent Continental thought has been to affirm the inseparability of violence and politics. Giorgio Agamben following Carl Schmitt argues that sovereignty itself cannot be thought without a founding violence, because the sovereign is by definition exempt from the law. This exemption establishes what both Schmitt and Agamben call the "state of exception." Jacques Derrida argues in a similar vein that acting in accord with law necessarily entails a certain lawlessness; the conditions of peace are an ineradicable violence. Both Agamben and Derrida take up the legacy of the ancient Greeks as support for this position. The assumption of this hermeneutic, however, is not simply to give an interpretation of the Greeks, but to say something about our present condition. Thus, for Agamben the state of exception found in Greek conceptions of sovereignty is fully exemplified in the concentration camp, and for Derrida the aporetic nature of our politics is already sketched out in the Greeks. Andrew Benjamin's new book provides an alternative reading of the Greeks and of our present condition.

In Place, Commonality and Judgment: Continental Philosophy and the Ancient Greeks, Andrew Benjamin continues his careful work at the intersection of ontology, aesthetics, and politics. The book as a whole sets itself several difficult tasks. First, it proposes to give an account of Greek life centered on the interconnection of being-in-place and being-in-common. Second, the method by which Benjamin proposes to articulate this account is through analyses of Greek writers such as Aeschylus, Pindar, and Heraclitus. Third, he shows the importance of these conceptions at the center of Greek life for contemporary theorizing. Finally, Benjamin takes up the conceptions gleaned from his analysis of ancient texts and uses them to respond to contemporary interventions in the ancient world, particularly the work of Derrida and Agamben. He argues that violence and the political are in principle separable.

Benjamin locates the starting point of his project in Aeschylus' Oresteia, in particular, the point where Athena intervenes in order to ask what it would mean to do justice to Orestes. For Benjamin the intervention of Athena points to what he calls a "caesura of allowing" (9), in which something new is possible. In this case, what arises is a new conception of justice. Aeschylus is writing at a transitional period in Greek history. Prior to this, justice is meted out by the gods. It is retributive and immediate. Following this intervention, "justice reemerges as bound up with decisions made by citizens" (9). This new conception of justice presupposes place and commonality, the ideas that Greek life is bound up with the polis. It also entails the necessity of conflict. If justice is bound up with decisions made by citizens, then deliberation and judgment will be bound up with the process of justice.

The necessity of conflict leads Benjamin to Heraclitus in the second chapter. Two things are at stake. First, Benjamin wants to place the well-known Heraclitus Fragment 53, "War is both the father of all and the king of all" (43), within the context of justice in the polis. On his reading justice can emerge only within the confines of the polis. Justice presupposes that the citizens of the polis exist as being-in-common. This being-in-common, though, is not the same as a unity. Citizens will not always agree about what is to be done. Crucially, though, Benjamin emphasizes that justice is a process. It is not the case that all pursuits of the good of the polis will be automatically and immediately just. Justice is always mediated. There can be no identification between justice and the statutes of the polis. Thus, for Benjamin, justice is the transcendental condition that makes individual statutes possible but is itself not one of these statutes.

The transcendental distinction between conditions and conditioned that Benjamin proposes is a recurring theme throughout the book, and it ultimately leads to his confrontation with Derrida and Agamben. What is at stake is the constitutive role of violence in politics. For both Derrida and Agamben violence is ineluctably part of the founding gesture of politics as such. Benjamin, in contrast, is arguing for "a conception of ethical and political philosophy in which violence [is] not attributed a founding role" (6). Benjamin's claim is that both Derrida and Agamben have misunderstood the Greeks and as a result have imported violence into the very heart of ethics, politics, and philosophy.

In the third chapter, Benjamin takes up the notion of place in the work of Heraclitus and Pindar in order to show that being-in-common is always already placed, that being-in-common and being-in-place are fundamental conditions of Greek life. In this case Heraclitus’s Fragments 44 and 114 are crucial to Benjamin's case. Both fragments connect the law and the city. Fragment 114 evokes being-in-common: "Speaking with understanding they must hold to what is shared by all, as a city holds to its law" (58). This creates an analogy between the citizen and the logos (i.e., "what is shared by all") and the city and its law. In Fragment 44 a similar analogy is created, but this time the focus is on place instead of commonality: "The people must fight for the law as for their city wall" (60). Benjamin's focus here is the city wall. The city wall creates a bounded space that divides inside from outside. Furthermore, it represents an internal division between what is shared and what is idiosyncratic, a theme that also runs through Heraclitus.

The centerpiece of the third chapter, though, is Benjamin's reading of Pindar in opposition to Agamben's. Particularly at issue is the phrase, "Law, the king of all," from Fragment 169a (63). This phrase plays a defining role in Agamben's Homo Sacer. For Agamben the reference to "the deeds of Herakles" in the same fragment indicates that law and violence are indissociable. Benjamin's reply is that the connection between law and violence depends on a confusion of law as the transcendental condition of particular statutes and the particular statutes themselves. In order to back up his point, Benjamin brings into play Pindar's Fragment 215a, "Customs vary among men, and each man/Praises his own way" (64). Pindar recognizes that individual customs and statutes vary, but this in no way excludes the necessity of customs and statutes. So, while there is an overarching order or law of the universe, this law will be actualized in different ways.

The fourth chapter returns Benjamin to the topic of translation, a theme that he has been concerned about since his Translation and the Nature of Philosophy (1989). In this case what concerns him is Hölderlin's translation of Pindar's Fragment 169a. Of course, the complexity is multiplied since Benjamin is not only concerned with Hölderlin's translation of Pindar into German, but the translation of both Pindar and Hölderlin into English. While in his earlier work Benjamin was concerned with the philosophical nature of translation, here he is concerned with the political nature of translation. He finds in both Pindar and, in particular, Hölderlin's translation of Pindar the same distinction between law and statute that allows him to disassociate law as such with violence and locate violence in the enforcement of various statutes.

On the one hand, what is original is law as the transcendental condition. Equally, what is also original is the continual realization and actualization of that ground in and through both the necessity of nomoi and the always already present demand for a place of actualization (91).

Benjamin's claims here reinforce the interconnection he sees among commonality, place and judgment that he first explored in Chapters 2 and 3.

As mentioned above, the final two chapters are criticisms of Derrida and Agamben. Chapter 6 deals with Derrida's reading of Sophocles in Of Hospitality, and Chapter 7 deals with Agamben's reading of Paul in The Time that Remains. Benjamin is much more sympathetic to Derrida than he is to Agamben. This sympathy derives in part from the way that Derrida has opened the way to thinking Greek philosophy beyond Heidegger's very long shadow. At stake in his reading here (and bolstered by the fifth chapter's discussion of Sophocles) is the meaning of the term "anomos," outside the law. For Derrida, Oedipus' position as anomos means that he is beyond the law as such, whereas Benjamin argues that the anomos can only refer to being outside the particular statutes of a polis. In fact, anomos can only have meaning by presupposing the transcendental condition of law.

For Benjamin, Agamben is guilty of the same confusion of conditions and conditioned, of law and statute. This time, however, the confusion arises in the reading of Paul's letter to the Romans. In particular, Agamben focuses on the passage in Romans 7 where Paul argues that those who belong to the Christian community are dead to the law and thus delivered from it. Agamben takes up the notion of being freed from the law as indicative of freedom from law as such. As we have seen, Benjamin thinks that this is impossible. Rather, the better reading of Paul here is that the Christian community has been freed from the particular statutes of Jewish law, but not law as such. Furthermore, and this is the end point of Benjamin's book, the relation that Paul institutes with regard to law as such represents the mirror opposite of Athena's intervention in the Oresteia. Whereas Athena's intervention opens up the space for democracy by making justice dependent on the work of citizens, Paul's intervention forecloses on this space by reinstituting an immediate relation of love between God and the Christian community.

The criticisms I have of the book are minor and are essentially a wish that Benjamin had been able to deal with more related material. For example, many parallels could be drawn between Benjamin's project and Jean-Pierre Vernant's The Origins of Greek Thought. Both Benjamin and Vernant locate the rise of Greek thought as a distinct entity in the founding of the polis. However, for Vernant this shift away from a people organized around palace life to an agonistic model organized around the agora would account for the way in which justice is mediated by place and commonality.

Additionally, given Benjamin's discussion of religion, particularly Pauline Christianity, as foreclosing on the openness of the Greeks, I wonder where René Girard's discussion of the relation between violence and archaic religion might fit in here. It seems that Girard would also criticize Agamben's account of Christianity, but at the same time argue that Christianity is able to separate, if not violence and the political, at least violence and religion.

My final concern is Benjamin's reliance on a kind of Kantian transcendentalism. He repeatedly argues for the transcendental separation of law and statute, that there is a crucial and unavoidable difference in kind between the conditions for the possibility of individual statutes and the statutes themselves. In resorting to this transcendental move, Benjamin repeats the methodological structure of both Derrida and Agamben without calling it into question, simply arguing for the replacement of one transcendental structure with another. Thus, while he makes a compelling case for this different transcendental structure, he never calls into question the structure itself.

The broad outlines of Benjamin's argument are clear, but I have scarcely done justice to the rich complexity of this book. It is a tour de force of patient textual analysis in Greek, German, French, and English. Furthermore, Benjamin's book provides an alternative to two dominant readings of Greek thought in Continental philosophy, Derrida's and Agamben's. On this final point a concluding chapter would have been helpful in order to draw together all of the themes of the book, particularly an implicit argument that Benjamin is having with Badiou, not only about the role of the universal in politics, but about the nature of the event itself. My hope is that in future works he will make explicit his criticisms of Badiou.