Plato and Heidegger: A Question of Dialogue

Placeholder book cover

Francisco J. Gonzalez, Plato and Heidegger: A Question of Dialogue, Penn State Press, 2009, 358pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271035581.

Reviewed by Megan Halteman-Zwart, Saint Mary's College



There is broad consensus that Heidegger’s ‘relationship’ with Plato is one of misrepresentation, caricature, and dismissal. Those unsympathetic to Heidegger point to his coercive readings of Plato’s dialogues, his single-minded focus on Plato as prototypical metaphysician and his violent use of history of philosophy in general. Those with more sympathy for Heidegger, while acknowledging these points, allow themselves to wistfully imagine what might have been if Heidegger had had the good sense to undertake a meaningful dialogue with Plato’s work, rather than merely to force Plato into a role that suited Heidegger’s agenda. Few, if any, have devoted significant attention to the many points in Heidegger’s lengthy career where Heidegger undertakes sympathetic and profitable engagements with Plato, largely because these charitable readings are hard to fit into the story of Heidegger’s Plato as original metaphysician — a story so forcefully and clearly laid out by Heidegger himself in the only work devoted to Plato which he choose to publish: the 1940 essay ‘Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit’. Francisco J. Gonzalez’s Plato and Heidegger: A Question of Dialogue makes many important contributions to our view of Heidegger’s Plato, but none is more important than its success at complicating this consensus story that Heidegger is merely a bad reader of Plato.

Gonzalez’s avowed goal is to take the dialogue between Plato and Heidegger further than Heidegger himself was willing or able to go. By undertaking an exhaustive look at both Heidegger’s sustained engagements with Plato and passing comments, Gonzalez rounds out our picture of Heidegger’s Plato to include many surprising affinities between the two thinkers. In most cases, Gonzalez admirably resists the temptation to downplay the charitable elements of Heidegger’s Plato even though attending to these elements calls for a more complicated story. Through the twists and turns of Heidegger’s often contradictory accounts of Plato, Gonzalez leads us to a surprisingly clear and compelling conclusion: Heidegger’s Plato is substantially more sympathetic than we have come to expect, but there is a deep and abiding difference between the two that presented a persistent road block to Heidegger’s reading of Plato; as Gonzalez puts it, ‘there was something genuinely foreign to Heidegger’s thought in Plato’s texts, something that Heidegger could not appropriate without fundamentally changing the direction of his own thinking’ (2). By the book’s conclusion, this obstacle is clear:

While neither Plato nor Heidegger looks for the truth of beings in beings themselves, Plato turns to logoi and how the truth of being manifests itself therein, whereas Heidegger insists on attempting to see and say being directly in a way that bypasses both beings and logoi (335).

Gonzalez characterizes this as a root difference in their very approaches to thinking being: Plato recognizes that our best efforts will remain ‘dialectical/dialogical’; Heidegger persists in aiming towards a ‘phenomenological/tautological’ approach (345). Due to this fundamentally different orientation, Heidegger is never able to really do justice to Plato’s thought.

The first virtue of Gonzalez’s account is his early acknowledgment of the sort of history that Heidegger is doing when he invokes Plato. Gonzalez reminds us on page one that Heidegger

never offers [his] interpretation as an objective, scholarly, and historical exegesis of what Plato said. The avowed goal of his interpretation is not accurately to represent and thereby retrieve the past, but to reawaken future possibilities for thought that remain unsaid in the texts of the past (1).

To ignore this fact about Heidegger-the-historian would be to enact upon Heidegger the very sort of violence that many have tried to point to in Heidegger’s work. To his credit, Gonzalez acknowledges Heidegger’s goal at the outset, though it seems that Gonzalez’s own careful readings of Plato lead him occasionally to forget this disclaimer and expect the same sort of approach from Heidegger.

It becomes clear early on that though Gonzalez is committed to confronting the sympathetic engagements with Plato that complicate the traditional account, the broad outline of the account will remain unchanged: Heidegger repeatedly passed up possibilities for real dialogue with Plato in favor of telling and retelling his own story of a Plato whose failure to wrest himself free from dialectic’s grip ushered in a disastrous transformation in the understanding of truth — from unconcealment to correctness. In other words, though Gonzalez’s account departs from the mainstream in its attention to the sympathies between Heidegger and Plato, it too takes Heidegger’s 1940 published essay ‘Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit’ to represent the most clear and reliable account of Heidegger’s Plato. Contradictory sympathetic accounts must be understood against the definitive claims of this brief essay, taken to best encapsulate Heidegger’s view.

In Part One, Gonzalez confronts Heidegger’s treatment of Plato in the Sophist lecture course from the early 1920s. The dominant theme in this course is Heidegger’s critique of Plato’s dialectic. At this point in his career, Heidegger has not yet soured on the idea of phenomenology as a science and he sees Aristotle’s approach to the pure seeing of noein as preferable to Plato’s commitment to dialectic that remains mired in logos. Gonzalez claims that here Heidegger’s desire for scientific philosophy presents itself as a critique of dialogue in Plato. Exposing an abiding feature of Heidegger’s view, Gonzalez shows that Heidegger ‘bypass[es] the chance of pursuing a genuinely dialogical interpretation of the Sophist in favor of a monological one’ (62). This preference for philosophy as ‘solitary seeing’ and prejudice against dialectic will explain Heidegger’s inability to ever really give Plato a fair read.

In these chapters Gonzalez presents a very compelling case for Heidegger’s early preference for Aristotle’s noein over Plato’s dialectic, but those familiar with the Sophist lectures might wish that he had lingered a bit more over the charitable elements of Heidegger’s appropriation of Plato found there. Certainly Gonzalez is right that Plato is taken to task for his inability to get beyond logos and dialectic to the pure seeing of noein, but Heidegger’s criticism of Plato throughout the Sophist lectures is mitigated by Heidegger’s repeated clarifications that Plato was asking crucial but difficult questions and that he operated with important distinctions but was not explicit about them because of the novelty of his inquiry.1 With respect to these points, Gonzalez’s representation of Heidegger’s Plato seems committed to reading such comments in line with what will become the agenda laid out by Heidegger’s most familiar and most maligned assessment of Plato: his reading of Plato’s Cave Analogy in the published essay of 1940.

In Part Two, Gonzalez takes up Heidegger’s interpretation of Plato’s role in the transformation of truth as it appears in the 1930s and 1940s. Here Gonzalez attempts to answer the important but vexing question of why Heidegger’s treatment of the Cave Analogy in lecture courses of the 1930s differs so dramatically from his treatment of the same text in the 1940 published lecture — it is impossible not to notice that the 1930s lectures are far more charitable to Plato than the reductive and dogmatic later essay. In the lecture courses, Heidegger casts Plato as a transitional figure who operates with the primordial understanding of truth as unconcealment, but because of his overreliance on the view that the Good is an idea like any other, he makes possible an unfortunate transition to understanding truth as a relationship, or correspondence, between seeing and what is seen. But in the essay, Heidegger’s focus is almost entirely on Plato as inaugural metaphysician. With careful scholarship and persuasive argument, Gonzalez traces the root of these differences to Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche. Heidegger’s ‘richer but conflicted readings’ in the lectures give way to ‘an increasingly simplifying and reductive reading’ in the essay as Heidegger becomes ever more committed to telling a simplified and persuasive story about the history of metaphysics from forefather Plato to his unlikely heir Nietzsche (120). This explains, for Gonzalez, why the 1940 lecture reads like a ‘propaganda packet aimed only at persuading us that Platonism is the beginning of the end’ (161).

According to Gonzalez, now that Heidegger has dropped the nuance from his reading of Plato and transformed ‘Plato’ into the scapegoat ‘Platonism’ by means of this damning essay, we have arrived at what ‘essentially represents the end of Heidegger’s interpretation of Plato, as if with this essay he had taken care of, or exorcised, Plato once and for all’ (162). This has surely been the consensus view about Heidegger’s Plato, but it seems peculiar to see Gonzalez’s unqualified endorsement of this view here, particularly because the rest of his book seems to undermine this very view by continuing to uncover Heidegger’s startlingly perceptive engagements with Plato.

In the chapters that follow, Gonzalez engages with several texts that prove problematic for the interpretation of Heidegger’s reductive Plato because they show possibilities for sympathy between Heidegger and Plato. Gonzalez uses these texts to show the internal contradictions in Heidegger’s own interpretation of Plato and concludes that there is call for us to go beyond Heidegger in imagining the productive dialogue that Heidegger suppressed. In chapter four, Gonzalez takes us through a reading of the second half of Heidegger’s lecture course on Plato’s Cave Analogy — the half devoted to the reading of the Theaetetus. Gonzalez calls this engagement evidence of ‘the dialogue that might have been’, and elsewhere he has called it a ‘discarded trace of a very different reading of Plato’.2 But again, he concludes that Heidegger ends up having to suppress this rich engagement because it doesn’t fit with the thesis of his 1940 lecture.

In chapter five, Gonzalez takes up Heidegger’s very interesting reading of the Republic‘s Myth of Er which appears in Heidegger’s 1942-43 course on Parmenides and Heraclitus, delivered, surprisingly, after his derisive essay is published. (One might take this to undermine Gonzalez’s earlier claim that the 1940 lecture allows Heidegger to close the door on Plato once and for all.) Again sympathies between Heidegger and Plato emerge, which Gonzalez finds shocking: ‘Where does Heidegger find the myth of lethe? … not in the early Greek poets, nor in the pre-Socratics, but in Plato. The strangeness of Heidegger’s turning to Plato for the mythic expression of lethe cannot be sufficiently emphasized’ (233). Again, Heidegger presents a reading of Plato that does not harmonize with the caricature presented in the inflammatory essay, but again Gonzalez explains it as a text

of what could be called the secret history of Heidegger’s reading of Plato on truth and untruth: in other words, what gets suppressed and occluded by the official and definitive position in ‘Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit’ (224).

One begins to wonder if there is really enough evidence to justify taking the view of the essay as ‘official and definitive’ of Heidegger’s view on Plato; perhaps with enough contrary evidence we should acknowledge that Heidegger’s reading of Plato is too complex to have an official and definitive position. This might require us to revise our understanding of the importance of the 1940 essay, but it’s not obvious that that couldn’t be done, particularly with the aid of Gonzalez’s rich and careful readings of Heidegger’s sympathetic Plato.

Gonzalez agrees that these alternative engagements with Plato strain Heidegger’s reductive thesis in the essay to the ‘breaking point’. The Plato that emerges in Heidegger’s reading of the Myth of Er is ‘irreducible to a doctrine, is much closer to Heidegger but therefore also a much more formidable opponent’ (255). Given Gonzalez’s view that the published essay must represent Heidegger’s official and definitive position, it makes sense to see an opponent in the Plato who is ‘much closer to Heidegger’. But readers might occasionally find themselves wishing that Gonzalez would pursue an interpretation that allows Heidegger to see Plato sometimes as ally rather than always as foe, and that doesn’t require us to see Heidegger’s charitable readings as ‘suppressed’ or ‘occluded’ primarily by the weight of one essay.

Gonzalez takes these contradictions in Heidegger’s dealings with Plato in the 1930s and 1940s to indicate that Heidegger had hit a brick wall in his work on Plato, and thus decided to abandon the engagement altogether. Finding Heidegger’s reductive view now rendered implausible by Heidegger’s own work, Gonzalez moves ahead on his own, helping the reader to imagine more about what direction a productive engagement between Heidegger and Plato might have looked like if Heidegger had not been so determined to close the door to just such an engagement. By following Gonzalez as he does what Heidegger might have done himself, the chapters that comprise Part Three of the book not only help the reader understand Heidegger, but also enrich our understanding of Plato’s dialectic.

In chapter six, Gonzalez returns to the discussion of Heidegger’s concerns about dialectic that were already present in the 1920s Sophist lectures. Now drawing from lectures of the 1950s as well as dialogues written by Heidegger in the 1940s, Gonzalez makes the persuasive point that Heidegger’s concerns about dialectic are really directed against Hegel’s dialectic and don’t apply to Plato’s. As Gonzalez says, Heidegger relies on a

characterization of dialectic as seeking to eliminate or level off the ambiguity that is in fact essential to philosophy: this characterization is clearly aimed at Hegel and has nothing to do with Plato, whose dialectic, as Heidegger himself recognizes, preserves ambiguity (265).

It is clear in this chapter that Gonzalez thinks Heidegger could have found in Plato an ally in the effort to avoid the perils of metaphysics, had he been willing to look. Following a suggestion made to Heidegger by Jaspers, Gonzalez argues that

we cannot transcend metaphysics by abandoning it in favor of an altogether different way of seeing and speaking; but we can transcend it by continually exposing its limitations in the dialectical manner of Plato, rather than absolutizing it in the dialectical manner of Hegel (289).

In other words, if Heidegger hadn’t been so ready to throw Plato’s baby out with Hegel’s bathwater, he might have noticed this. But, Gonzalez tells us, he does not. In spite of many opportunities to do so, in spite of many charitable engagements with Plato at various times, ultimately the opportunity is missed because

he remains committed to this rejection [of dialectic] to the very end because he remains committed to a characterization of thinking as a tautological (and thus monological) thinking-saying-seeing (noesis) that as such transcends any and all dialectic (291).

Gonzalez further supports this point with a fascinating comparison between Plato’s dialogues and the few dialogues Heidegger himself wrote, arguing that even Heidegger’s dialogues manage to come off as monologues, aimed at the ‘solitary seeing’ that will always cut Heidegger off from Plato.

In chapter seven, Gonzalez’s final chapter, he turns to Heidegger’s 1962 lecture and related seminar, ‘Zeit und Sein’. Here Gonzalez shows again an unexpected affinity between Heidegger’s thought and Plato’s. It is in ‘Zeit und Sein’, Gonzalez tells us, that Heidegger wants to think being as Ereignis, without reference to beings or metaphysics or even his own earlier destruction of metaphysics. Of course this effort is complicated by Heidegger’s admission that ‘the matter at stake prohibits our speaking of it by way of a statement’.3 Given this difficulty, Heidegger must pronounce his own lecture an obstacle to the very kind of thinking he wants to pursue — after all, he concludes, ‘the lecture has spoken merely in propositional statements’.4 But here is where Gonzalez sees an important affinity. Heidegger admits that he cannot do what he thinks must be done, that his attempts to call for such a new kind of thinking are not only failures, but even obstacles to the very thinking called for. Gonzalez explains this paradox as follows: ‘a form of thinking that can get at what it wishes to express only negatively by working against the forms of expression it is forced to employ could certainly with justice be called dialectical’ (302).

But though Gonzalez sees an affinity between Plato’s dialectic and Heidegger’s desire to think being as Ereignis, Gonzalez claims that Heidegger’s criticism of dialectic remains largely unchanged from the Sophist lectures of the 1920s to ‘Zeit und Sein’ four decades later. In spite of some real shifts in Heidegger’s thought about the Greeks — he worries less that Plato thinks of being as production (311), his concerns about the Greeks’ view of being as static presence have softened (320), he recognizes the need to use images to express being (335) — Heidegger still dismisses dialectic, preferring the monological, direct seeing of phenomenology. Gonzalez explains this difference using an image borrowed from Socrates:

Heidegger insists on looking directly at the sun of being in eclipse (withdrawal, Entzug); he wants to bring being ‘as’ Ereignis ‘into view’. Plato, on the other hand, believes that such an attempt can result only in blindness and therefore confines himself to ‘seeing’ the truth of beings indirectly as reflected in logoi (335).

So, on Gonzalez’s view, Heidegger had real opportunities to engage Plato charitably, but because of a fundamental difference in the understanding of the goal of philosophy itself, he instead ‘for the most part closed off the possibility’ of real dialogue, ‘turning Plato into something called ’Platonism’ by means of extremely broad and simplistic interpretive strokes, and by ultimately making the name ‘Plato’ a label for the extreme other of his own thought’ (343). Gonzalez’s argument is very persuasive in its claim that there is an important, abiding difference between Plato and Heidegger which, when understood, can shed light on the instances in which Heidegger insists on casting Plato as the original metaphysician in his sweeping tale of the history of philosophy. But given Gonzalez’s fair and rich accounts of the many affinities between Heidegger and Plato’s thought throughout Heidegger’s career — affinities Heidegger himself often recognized — one wonders if he doesn’t somewhat undermine his own claim that Heidegger’s relationship with Plato is primarily one of ‘broad and simplistic interpretive strokes’, best characterized by the ‘official and definitive’ position laid out in the 1940 essay ‘Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit’. Gonzalez’s account is more complete, more thorough and more attentive to the sympathies between Heidegger and Plato than any other account of which I am aware, but it does not fundamentally depart from the traditional assessment that Heidegger is basically content to use Plato as a character in Heidegger’s own tale and suppress what doesn’t fit that story. Perhaps there is not sufficient reason to substantially revise this traditional story, but Gonzalez’s detailed accounts of Heidegger’s alternative Plato suggests that perhaps there is, even if Gonzalez himself doesn’t go quite that far.

In spite of this, however, it is hard to overstate how important Gonzalez’s contribution is to the current discussion on Heidegger’s Plato. No one has yet undertaken such a thorough study of Heidegger’s Plato over the course of Heidegger’s career, and Gonzalez does it with enviable clarity and completeness. His scholarship is careful, and easy to follow; his argument is original and persuasive. In fact, it is very hard to imagine future contributions to the discussion that do not take account of Gonzalez’s argument. But as Gonzalez himself tells us, this is surely not the last word on Heidegger’s Plato. If Gonzalez has succeeded at his task, which I believe he quite ably has, he has opened a space in which a dialogue between Plato and Heidegger can occur. It is now for the rest of us to imagine the positive possibilities for future engagement that might occur in that space.

1 Martin Heidegger, Plato’s Sophist, trans. Richard Rojcewicz and Andre Schuwer, Indiana UP, 1997, 137, 378.

2 Francisco J. Gonzalez, ‘Dialogue Discontinued: Heidegger on a Few Pages of Plato’s Theaetetus‘, Epoche 11(2007): 372.

3 Martin Heidegger, ’Time and Being’, On Time and Being, trans. Joan Stambaugh. University of Chicago Press, 2002, 20.

4 Heidegger, ‘Time and Being’, 24.