Plato and Plotinus on Mysticism, Epistemology and Ethics

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David J. Yount, Plato and Plotinus on Mysticism, Epistemology and Ethics, Bloomsbury, 2017, 311 pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474298421.

Reviewed by Georges Leroux, Université du Québec à Montréal


In his new study of the similarities between Plato and Plotinus, David J. Yount proceeds to a meticulously argued demonstration of the thesis he had already put forward in his preceding book (Plotinus the Platonist: A Comparative Account of Plato and Plotinus’ Metaphysics, Bloomsbury, 2016). According to him, there are no essential differences between their philosophical doctrines. This thesis has a long history, and it has been discussed in numerous, if not all, modern and contemporay studies devoted to the influence of Plato’s doctrines on Plotinus. As Yount reminds us in the opening pages, referring to E. N. Tigerstedt’s seminal work (Interpreting Plato, 1977), this debate goes back to the discussion of the unwritten doctrines of Plato, a discussion that led to a revival of the so called ‘esoteric view’ of Plato’s dialogues. Did Plato teach such an esoteric doctrine to a limited audience, or was not this esoteric doctrine the true interpretation of Plato’s dialogues, when read according to the hermeneutical rules of the Neoplatonists? Plotinus, for one, never alludes to any esoteric interpretation, and his philosophy is systematically presented as a straightforward and faithful exposition of the Platonic dialogues. The question then is: is the Neoplatonic exposition faithful, if not identical, to Plato’s doctrine, and what are the commentators to do with the apparent, and sometimes very important, differences between the Neoplatonic doctrine and the original canon of the Platonic tradition? Should the commentator consider the main difference, opposing a monist and a dualist account of being, as a result of an error in the historical interpretation of Plato?

The demonstration presented here is divided among three chapters. In chapter 1, Yount discusses the nature and possibility of the ultimate philosophical experience of the first principle of being. This experience or vision is mystical, and according to this interpretation of Plotinus’ doctrine of the One and the account he gives of the experience of union, Plotinus was a mystic, and every element in Plato’s dialogues referring to that kind of experience leads Yount to argue that Plato was a mystic as well. Chapter 2 offers a comprehensive analysis of all the topics classified under the general category of ‘Epistemology’: the nature of knowledge and its degrees, the method of dialectics and the doctrine of recollection. Finally, in chapter 3, Yount examines a series of ethical questions, regarding happiness, love, purification, the nature of virtues, and several others. In order to assess the reality of the similarities or differences between Plato and Plotinus, Yount presents a “principle of compatibility”, and he argues that on all epistemological and ethical issues they do not hold essentially different views: there are no “differences on philosophically significant matters” (p.6). This argument does not entail a complete philosophical identity, but is limited to the affirmation that there is no “essential difference”. The application of the compatibility principle leads in all three chapters to the same conclusion: Plotinus is not only the true heir of Plato, but his philosophy is in line with all the main metaphysical, epistemological and ethical claims of his master.

Each chapter follows an identical method. Yount presents a systematic account of all the pertinent passages of both philosophers related to the topics discussed, for which he reproduces a personal translation from the Greek, or a translation by others that he amends or adapts. This aspect of the method needs a short comment, since most philological issues raised in the presentation are not discussed as such, but mainly to accommodate the main interpretive thesis. This is not to say that these translations are incorrect, but only that they are not justified as such. The philological contribution of the book is not its main objective, even if, as the history of scholarship on nearly all these texts tends to show, all these passages are filled with interpretive issues for which philology has something to offer. The abundant notes (pp. 203-261) provide many elements to complement that approach.

The main focus of this book is rather on the philosophical statements drawn by Yount from this complex comparative compilation of passages. The reader is confronted with a file of texts, each of which is assigned to an interpretation of the important arguments, but the discussion relies on a methodical analysis of these arguments. Let’s consider the arguments presented in chapter 1. According to Yount, Plato and Plotinus describe the goal of philosophy as the quest for the “ultimate experience”, and they speak of it as a “vision”. Most modern commentators resist the idea of a mystical Plato, but Plotinus is “nearly unanimously taken to be a mystic”. Starting from that, Yount provides us with a philosophical analysis of the nature of this experience: (1) it gives ultimate answers to the essential questions of philosophy; (2) it is everlasting or self-sustaining; (3) it is difficult and rare; (4) it is ineffable; and (5) it has several requirements. All of these statements have a long history in the interpretation of both philosophers, and one would require in the beginning some basic definition of what it is to be a mystic, but Yount thinks that such a definition is either impossible, or not necessary for a comparative project such as the one he proposes: “If I can show that Plato describes the experience in the same way as Plotinus, then the precise definition of mysticism is moot.” This argument builds on the “compatibility principle”, referred to by Yount as a methodological standpoint for his work. In the case of mysticism, the conclusion could be summarized as follows: if Plotinus claims to have an experience of the One or the Good, and if we can show that Plato shared that “vision”, then Plato can be said to have had such an experience. This is the requirement for an interpretation that is comprehensive, compatible and open at the same time. Yount discusses in detail the concurrent readings in recent scholarship, and his position, not surprisingly considering his premises, is that the Neoplatonic doctrine was already present in Plato. This conclusion leads him, to give only one example, to criticize the interpretation of Lloyd P. Gerson (Plotinus, 1994), who took the very different position that one can best understand Plotinus when ignoring his so-called mystical stance.

The epistemological issues discussed in chapter 2 are no less controversial. Plotinus’ concept of the Intellect (Nous) represents a quasi-theological interpretation of the world of Forms, but according to Yount, we can identify at least six main points on which, here again, Plato and Plotinus do not differ: (1) Intellect possesses wisdom, and the human soul, being divine by essence, acquires wisdom through the process of contemplation of Intellect, that is of the Forms; (2) pure knowledge has the Forms as its objects; (3) the practice of dialectic is the surest way to attain true knowledge; (4) the soul, in the process of knowing, recollects prior knowledge; (5) prayer is useless without action and knowledge; and (6) there is a scale of degrees of knowledge, opinion being an inferior kind to true knowledge. This last argument summarizes the whole discussion, since Plato and Plotinus hold firmly that there is a scale of kinds or degrees of knowledge, culminating in a supra-dialectical kind. But what is the modern commentator to do with the Neoplatonic doctrine of the metaphysical scale of hypostases itself, in which Intellect represents a true novelty? The core of modern Neoplatonic scholarship is devoted to that issue, starting from A. H. Armstrong (The Architecture of the Intelligible Universe, 1940) to Lloyd P. Gerson. Is this quasi-substantial Intellect, that Plotinus identified with Plato’s demiurge, a correct interpretation of the world of forms?

The last chapter discusses a number of ethical issues, all linked to the quest for happiness (eudaimonia), including the Platonic concept of virtue as based on knowledge, and the claim that the search for wisdom is the supreme condition of happiness. This state of the soul happens when reason guides the soul and dominates the inferior parts. Yount argues that this doctrine, present in all the dialogues of Plato, is fully reflected in Plotinus’ ethics (I,4,2,31s), including the arguments on happiness as a state, and not a process or an action. The section on love also leads to a very rich comparison, Plotinus having devoted a full treatise, echoing the Symposium, to that subject (III, 5). The reader will find in that chapter a fascinating section on “How to live”, based on a careful reading of Plotinus’ treatise on the Good (VI,9): the practice of philosophy lies at the center of this ethical doctrine, since both Plato and Plotinus urge the wise man to endorse philosophical life. In the course of this section, Yount discusses the often-repeated accusation against Plotinus that his lack of a political philosophy would make him a “Plato dimidiatus”. His conclusion, though, that Plato and Plotinus held that “philosophers make the bests rulers”, is drawn from very light evidence in Plotinus, and one should recall that the task of philosophy remains in his doctrine mostly contemplative. Can we find in Plotinus any injunction to get back to the cave? This chapter presents a substantial analysis of the main arguments on ethical matters, leading to a confirmation of the “compatibility principle”: on all these statements (for example, the preeminence of philosophic virtue over civic virtue), the agreement between Plato and Plotinus remains undisputable. Reading that chapter, one would suggest that Yount, building on his comparative file of texts, should engage in a fully developed presentation of Plotinus’s ethics. His analysis of the main theses is comprehensive (all the themes are alluded to) but disappointing, the treatment being so short.

All in all, the method of this book rests on a comparative procedure that raises a number of issues that both Platonic and Neoplatonic scholars will undoubtedly want to discuss. There is of course one important reason for that: the identity between two philosophical doctrines, even when drawn from a comparison between pertinent texts on specific topics, cannot put aside the general nature of interpretation and the reality of influence. The fact that Plotinus was a disciple of Plato, that he considered the dialogues as a philosophical doctrine equivalent to a canon of sacred texts, and spent his life teaching the Platonic doctrine as embodying the truth on all topics—all these considerations go beyond the methodological framework of a file of texts. A correct formulation of the procedure should then be: did Plotinus read Plato correctly? On all matters where, according to Yount, their doctrines “did not differ essentially”, what is the philosophical contribution of Neoplatonism? Many arguments may be similar, and in many cases identical; this doesn’t settle the question of the essential difference of their philosophies as distinct enterprises. Plotinus may have understood his personal endeavour as a simple reading or commentary of Plato, but the Enneads, when read as a whole, is plainly something different, if only in virtue of its monist stance and metaphysical structure. This book will be a very useful synthesis for that discussion, but not as a position on the ongoing debate on the nature of Neoplatonism.

I conclude with a short remark on the bibliography and notes. Both are very rich, and they echo the complexity and volume of recent scholarship. In his very detailed notes, Yount discusses many questions at length, supplementing the brevity of the presentation in the body of the text. Being a francophone reader, I must express a reservation: it is for me a matter of disappointment that he has limited his research to scholarship published in English, leaving aside the important material he could have drawn from the German, French and Italian traditions. For one, I think he would have found a different approach in the French tradition, for example in the work of Pierre Hadot (of whom only an introductory study is quoted in an English translation), not to mention the excellent book of Jean-Marie Charrue (Plotin, lecteur de Platon, 1978), devoted to just that topic.