Plato and the Invention of Life

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Michael Naas, Plato and the Invention of Life, Fordham University Press, 2018, 255pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823279685.

Reviewed by Jill Gordon, Colby College


At the heart of Michael Naas's excellent book is a deep, careful, and enlightening reading of Plato's Statesman. In addition to its focused attention to this dialogue, however, the book deploys its interpretation of themes in the Statesman in order to open up the Platonic corpus and the core ideas we take to be Platonism in truly original and wide-ranging ways. The book's broader insights are about the notion of life evoked in Naas's title, and the path there is a long, complex one, well worth our time and attention. Naas provides a new way to think about the lines that divide Plato's well-known dichotomies, such as divine/human, soul/body, being/becoming, immortal/mortal, speech/writing, human/animal, and of course, life/death. Despite its detail, intricacy, and nuance, which I will not be able to capture fully in this review, the work is clearly and well written and does not require familiarity with the scholars whom Naas engages in depth (Derrida, Foucault, Kahn, Miller, Rosen, and White, most frequently among several others).[1] Derrida's work, in particular, establishes important framing and groundwork for Naas.

At the center of Naas's book is the myth of the Two Ages in the Statesman, The Age of Kronos and The Age of Zeus. Naas's multiple interests in the myth include the connection between the myth and diairēsis or the dividing up of things; the prominent and significant use of the word automatos in the myth and elsewhere in Plato's dialogues; the metaphors of the shepherd and the weaver in the myth and their exact relation to each other; and the nature of the written, as opposed to spoken, word. Naas uses these issues to ground what he says ultimately about life.

Chapter 1 focuses on diairēsis in the Statesman and the many lines and divisions elsewhere in Plato's dialogues. Beyond diairēsis itself, the organic metaphor used to describe the division along the natural joints and parts of things puts the Statesman in conversation with Phaedrus, where logos is represented by an organic metaphor that tells us that every logos must be organized like a living being (zōon) with a body and all the proper appendages, each in a fitting relationship with each other. Being is presented here as something that contains natural dividing places (diaphuên), and the knowing person can find and then divide it along these lines. The question looming in the background of this early chapter, and gestured at in Naas's introductory chapter, is whether Being might itself also be a living organism, and diairēsis the knowledge of dividing it, too, at its natural joints and articulations.

The myth of the Two Ages contains frequent and strategic use of the term, automatos, and that is the focus of Chapter 2. The term automatos appears first at the beginning of the myth when the Stranger describes the transitional moment between the two ages, the moment in which Kronos lets go of his guidance of the cosmos, when "of its own accord," or "spontaneously," it turns backward in the opposite direction. This universe is a living thing (zōon) that perpetually moves and reverses its movement. The term automatos then appears four additional times in the myth. Naas provides a detailed argument that we must understand automatos to mean not just a positive sense of being free or spontaneous. Since human life in the Age of Kronos is also described as a bios automatos, and many translators have taken that to mean something like "free," Naas argues that the term must connote, at the same time, something more negative: "because, as we hear later in the myth, the universe degenerates or loses its power as it turns backward . . . this automatic movement must also be understood negatively, as a movement that is unguided, haphazard, set adrift -- like a boat whose helmsman has abandoned it, or a state whose originary statesman has gone away, or a discipline whose master has vanished, or a son whose father has died" (67).

Naas argues in Chapter 3 against Foucault's interpretation of this myth, while furthering his own thesis on life. Foucault's desire to demonstrate the rise of sovereign power in Europe out of the Christian Church's pastoral power compels him to read the Two Ages myth in two erroneous ways: he claims no appreciable awareness of pastoral power in the ancient Greek world, and he reads the myth as one in which the metaphor of shepherding in the Age of Kronos (which he associates with pastoral power) is superseded by the metaphor of weaving in the Age of Zeus (which he associates with sovereign power). Naas shows convincingly, however, that Foucault is wrong on both counts, and most importantly, that the type of political power deployed in the Age of Zeus depends on the metaphor of weaving and retains important elements of shepherding. (Throughout the book, Naas returns to this insight that multiple metaphors in the dialogues often work together to provide a multi-faceted view of the concept or phenomena they represent. The Statesman, in fact, contains yet more metaphors -- the helmsman or navigator, the physician -- that work alongside one another to provide a wide view of political power.) This chapter also makes a case for the centrality of mimēsis in the myth. The relation between the Age of Kronos, when the god is in control of the cosmos, and the Age of Zeus, when he relinquishes control and humans take over, is one in which the latter aims to imitate the former. The relation of mimēsis is, Naas argues, absolutely central to the Platonic project. It is "another way to rethink participation and recollection, the relationship between particulars and form, examples and essence, the many and the one, becoming and being" (93-94). Naas will later trouble all of these mimetic relationships.

Chapters 4, 5, and 6 begin to pull together the threads of mimēsis, memory, division, writing, and law. They add complexity to Naas's reading of the Statesman and the myth of the Two Ages by taking up logos, and thus also demonstrate the Statesman's deep connections to the Phaedrus. Using Derrida's essay, "Plato's Pharmacy" as a touchstone, Naas focuses on these two dialogues' shared sense of the fatherlessness of the written word as opposed to the generation by a father of living speech, as well as "the inferiority of the written law to living discourse and the necessity of writing for life in the polis or a life in philosophy" (116). Naas sees life as thus central to the division between writing and speech. As he does more robustly in his conclusions, Naas here begins to destabilize our, shall we say, simple reading of Plato in which we draw the parallels speech/living//writing/death because Plato uses the metaphor of "writing in the soul" to describe living speech in the Phaedrus (276a). Naas makes the case at length that "Law is here criticized in the Statesman in precisely the terms in which writing is condemned in the Phaedrus. Everything that Socrates finds problematic and even dangerous about writing in the Phaedrus is echoed in the Stranger's critique of law in the Statesman" (146). The written law, by contrast to the living statesman, is inferior. And yet, written law is necessary. As Naas reads the passages on the six regimes posited by the Stranger, all are imitations of the one true government in which the ruler, alive and with epistēmē, rules without law. The telos of the statesman, Naas argues, is life; that is to say, he weaves together different characters in the city for the sake of a common life.

In the final two chapters, two novel ideas begin to emerge. First, the Two Ages myth shows that memory, division, logos, and imitation all help to link and to separate two things: what we call life, whose analogue rests in the Age of Zeus, and something we might think of as life itself or the Form of life, whose analogue rests in the Age of Kronos. Life itself leaves traces in what we call life. And while Naas does not focus too much energy on Agamben's distinction between zoē and bios, and in the end does not want to rely on any rigid and wholly consistent use of these particular terms in Plato's work, he does use Agamben's work to illustrate his larger point that bios, or what we call life, has these traces of real life, and that Plato shows, especially in the so-called later dialogues, how bios becomes detached from zoē. "At issue in dialogues ranging from the Apology to the Gorgias to the Laws is the question of what makes life, bios, most biōtos, most livable or most worth living and, by contrast, what makes it least livable and least worthy of being lived" (166).

In his conclusion, we see most explicitly that Naas's project is itself an exercise in deconstruction, and herein lies his second and most original claim. He returns to Derrida's life death, which is other than life itself and what we call life.

This other life, as a life that loves to hide, would be the life that draws and redraws the lines between all these different kinds of lives as well as between life and death, the human and the animal, life and non-life, the organic and the inorganic, physis and technē, being and logos, and so on . . . Instead of life itself, then, instead of the Form of life, there would be life death as what exceeds the neat boundaries between life and death, a life before all life forms or ideas, in short, a life before conception. (187-188)

Derrida's entire deconstruction project, Naas argues, could be viewed as the uncovering of this life death which "compromises from the start anything like a pure life or a purely living present" (189).

Elaborating on life death, Naas returns to the myth that has occupied most of the central pages of the book. He summarizes three possible readings of the myth. The first is a dualistic, traditional Platonic reading that prioritizes the Age of Kronos and sees it as the model that the Age of Zeus aims to imitate; in this instance, Naas says, the son must remember the father. The second interpretation would prioritize the age of Zeus and sees the Age of Kronos as a projection that could only have been made in the Age of Zeus; here, the son invents the father. The third reading would be one in which neither Age has priority over another, but both are the effect of "another thinking of life" that itself draws lines, say, between life and death, between father and son, and so on.

neither the father nor the son would thus come first but a life death that . . . first distinguishes father from son, ruler from ruled, and so on. All this would be another way of saying that in Plato, there is at once Platonism, the opposite of Platonism, and that which disrupts -- or deconstructs -- that Platonism. (196)

I found the closing of the book particularly interesting regarding its resonances with Naas's analysis of the father/son dichotomy that arises in the context of his discussion of both the Statesman's and the Phaedrus's critique of writing. As Naas describes in an earlier chapter, the Phaedrus shows that the logos is a zôon or living creature (264c), and as such, it must have been engendered.

Derrida will thus go on to demonstrate 'the permanence of a Platonic schema that assigns the origin and power of speech, precisely of logos, to the paternal position' [Plato's Pharmacy, 76] . . . the father in Plato is the source or origin not just of speech but of value more generally, including and especially the value of life -- the father, notice, before or without or to the exclusion of the mother, which of course orients and determines everything. (117)

Writing, in contrast to the living logos, is linked to the absence of the father who is not present to defend his offspring. The written text is fatherless. "'It goes without saying,' Derrida will conclude, 'that the god of writing,' in this case Theuth (the Egyptian equivalent of Hermes), 'must also be the god of death' ['Plato's Pharmacy,' 91]" (118).

One could not help but think of Derrida's death in 2004, his fatherless texts that frame Naas's work, Naas's own close tutelage with this father figure, and now the text we have before us, itself the son of the intellectual son of pater Derrida. And of course, we cannot forget the absent father of the text that generated Derrida's writing, that generated Naas's writing about the fatherless texts and on which we are now focused: Plato. It was with these thoughts in mind that I read, in the closing lines of the book, this long and poignant sentence:

Despite everything, then, the word automatos remains in the dialogue, a trace, perhaps, of Plato's hesitation regarding another thinking of life, nothing less, in short, than another philosophy, a philosophy of contingency, philosophy as it might have become, a thinking of life untethered from its source, separated from true life or from a form of life, a life able to live, then, on its own for a time, a Platonic thinking of life within the Platonic dialogues that will have perhaps become, by whatever accident or necessity, untethered from Plato or at least from Platonism, set adrift from its father and teacher, unable to be taken in and boarded by Christianity, for example, left to wander like a phantom ship or like the universe itself in the Age of Zeus but without any promise or prospect of a god or an Age of Kronos returning to save it. (199-200)

These seem to be the issues that might ultimately animate Naas and his reflections on Plato, Derrida, life and death.

The book lacks a bibliography, which is perhaps a comment more on the editorial process than the book itself; I found myself on more than one occasion having to hunt through the notes to find a reference. Naas's book is filled with puns and plays on words that don't draw attention to themselves, but which help to emphasize his points and delight the reader -- at least this one. The big picture emerges slowly here, and seeing how all the many insights about the Statesman congeal into a vision of "Plato's invention of life" takes some work on the part of the reader. This book is essential reading for anyone interested in the Statesman, and it is filled with original insights about its importance in the corpus, its connections to other dialogues, and its centrality to a range of Platonic themes not normally associated with it.

[1] Though Naas is in conversation often with several of each authors' works, the primary texts are: Jacques Derrida, H.C. for Life, That is to Say…, trans. Laurent Milesi and Stefan Herbrechter (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2006) and "Plato's Pharmacy," in Dissemination, trans. Barbara Johnson (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981); Michele Foucault, Security, Territory, Population: Lectures at the Collège de France, 1977-1978, trans. Graham Burchell (New York: Picador, 2007); Charles H. Kahn, "The Myth of the Statesman," in Plato's Myths, ed. Catlin Partenie (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009), 153; Mitchell Miller, The Philosopher in Plato's Statesman; Stanley Rosen, Plato's Statesman: The Web of Politics (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1995); David A. White, Myth, Metaphysics and Dialectic in Plato's Statesman (Burlington, Vt.: Ashgate Publishing Company, 2007).