Plato, Aristotle, and the Purpose of Politics

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Kevin M. Cherry, Plato, Aristotle, and the Purpose of Politics, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 246pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107021679.

Reviewed by Jill Frank, University of South Carolina, Columbia


The scholarly norm treats as a mere passing reference Aristotle's gestures to Plato's Statesman near the beginning of the Politics. Kevin Cherry's book, however, stages an extended conversation between Aristotle and the Statesman's Eleatic Stranger. Inviting those who have seen mostly similarities between Aristotle and the Eleatic Stranger to take account also of their substantial and important differences, Cherry elaborates with nuance and care their respective views on topics ranging from the relation between nature and humankind to the goals and ends of politics to the practices, institutions, and study of politics. Offering a "textual encounter" (4) between Aristotle and the Eleatic Stranger, Cherry's book is also a window onto large and important matters of interpretation and substance that affect how we understand the political philosophies of Plato and Aristotle and also how these bear on issues of modern and contemporary political theory and political life. Cherry's originality and contribution lie in his choice of Plato's Eleatic Stranger as a sustained interlocutor for Aristotle and also in the accounts of politics and philosophy he elaborates by way of their confrontation. Reducible neither to scientific knowledge nor to power (207), the Aristotelian politics that emerges is a refreshing supplement to paradigms of politics current in the disciplines of philosophy and political science, one that invites us "to raise our expectations for political life" (213) by offering "richer possibilities for political practice" (206).

After providing a persuasive justification for reading the Politics through the lens of the Statesman in chapter one, chapter two sets out the foundational terrain of the book in what Cherry argues are the different understandings offered by the Eleatic Stranger and Aristotle of nature and hence of the purposes of politics. For the Eleatic Stranger, a hostile nature, posing dangers to human beings, drives them together to form political communities oriented to preservation. But on Aristotle's account, nature's hospitality to human beings guides them, by way of the "gift of logos" to work together toward common goals and to form political communities oriented to human flourishing and the good life (4, 37, 71, 177, passim). In the view of the Eleatic Stranger, stability is a, if not the, key virtue of a regime (70). But Aristotle also prizes what is good and just and advantageous, as well as the exercise of "reasoned speech" (60, quoting Bernard Yack) to determine and achieve these desirable political ends.

The next two chapters explore the practical and theoretical repercussions of these first-order differences. They focus on how the Eleatic Stranger and Aristotle differently taxonomize and evaluate regimes and their institutions (chapter three) and what they take to be the knowledge and measures proper to the study of politics (chapter four). The Eleatic Stranger takes a good constitution to require first and foremost a "true statesman" with "gnostic knowledge" in whose absence the rule of law will suffice (131). And in any case, it requires citizens incapable of participating in politics owing to their lack of knowledge (78-81, 103) but capable, in virtue of their true opinion, of obedience to rule. Aristotle favors regimes (106-16) that depend on laws oriented to a common good and in which citizens, guided by the political knowledge of rulers (139-41), are capable of participating in politics on the basis of their practical and experiential knowledge or phronesis (103-7, 131-35). Where the Eleatic Stranger asks after the statesman "for the sake of improving dialectical inquiry" and thus subordinates politics to truth (117, 135-37), Aristotle insists on "the necessity of political life for us to lead a good contemplative life" (198), treating the practice and study of politics as the "supreme and architectonic art" (137-39).

Chapter five discusses the interpretative significance for both Plato and Aristotle in of these differences between the Eleatic Stranger and Aristotle. In chapter six, Cherry makes a case for Aristotle's ongoing relevance to modern and contemporary discussions about "the origins, purpose, and practice of politics" (3). Against both unified and developmental interpretative approaches, he treats the Eleatic Stranger not as Plato's mouthpiece but instead as a character in Plato's dialogs (173-176). Espousing a politics "that had a great deal of currency in the fourth-century Hellenic world" (10), one that elides the distinction between authority and force (207) and is based in rational knowledge understood in mathematical terms (20), the Eleatic Stranger, on Cherry's account, is to be read not only against Aristotle but also against Plato's Socrates (144-62). Cherry develops a rich triangulation between these three positions, arguing that despite the substantial criticisms by Aristotle in Politics 2 of Socrates' proposals for the kallipolis in Republic 5, and despite significant differences between Aristotle and Socrates (164-72), both advocate an experience-based knowledge for a politics oriented to an education in becoming good (155, 163), a politics that understands itself less as a mathematical science than as an art oriented to the noble (to kalon, also the beautiful).

Consistent with his refusal to treat the characters in Plato's dialogs as spokesmen for Plato, Cherry never adverts to "what Plato says" or "what Plato thinks" but only to what Plato has the Eleatic Stranger and/or Socrates say. This leads to the following question, invited by the terms of Cherry's project but which his book does not address: if, as Cherry so persuasively demonstrates, Aristotle and the Eleatic Stranger offer conflicting appreciations of the origins, aims, and ends of politics, and Socrates and the Eleatic Stranger do as well, and if, as Cherry rightly maintains, Plato is to be identified with neither the Eleatic Stranger nor Socrates (also only a character in Plato's dialogs (173)), then might anything at all be said about Plato's political philosophy?

Central to Cherry's disaffiliation of Aristotle's political theory from that of the Eleatic Stranger is Aristotle's commitment to politics as an art of good character and living well. Against those who insist on separating Aristotle's theoretical sciences from his ethical and political thought (185-88), Cherry bases Aristotle's vision of politics in his understanding of nature, grounding the difference in the visions of politics offered by the Eleatic Stranger and Aristotle in their contrasting appreciations of nature. As Cherry puts it, "Whereas politics arises out of nature's neglect -- or hostility -- for the Eleatic, for Aristotle it arises out of the way in which an orderly nature is hospitable to human life" (57). In chapter six, Aristotle's understandings of nature and politics are also contrasted with those expounded by modern and contemporary theorists like Machiavelli, Hobbes, Locke, and John Rawls, whose accounts, Cherry convincingly shows, bear important resemblances to those of the Eleatic Stranger (177-83). In the course of the entire book, Cherry's accounts of the Eleatic Stranger and Aristotle on nature thus bear the burden of his arguments about the aims and ends of politics. He offers careful and considered readings which he puts in productive conversation with a broad, deep, and diverse secondary literature that consistently cuts across traditional scholarly divides in both philosophy and political theory.

Attending to Aristotle's Politics and also the Physics and Metaphysics, Cherry agrees with Stephen Salkever "that the world consists of what 'we call kinds or species and Aristotle calls natures' (1990: 20)" (189) -- "distinct individual natures" (64) -- each of which has a telos or end, which is to pursue its own good, and which natures, together, give rise to what Cherry calls "the order of nature" (65). The order of nature, Cherry claims quoting Istvan Bodnar, "'is the way the animal, in a teleological manner, meshes with its environment' (Bodnar 2005: 27)" (65, footnote omitted). So understood, the order of nature seems to be all and only an aggregation of the distinct individual natures of the beings and organisms that populate the world, which is to say, an aggregation of beings and organisms which, in the language of Physics.2, have within themselves a principle of staying the same and change (192b13-14).

Cherry, however, appears to have more in mind for Aristotle's understanding of nature. Developing an account of "nature simply" (190, quoting Salkever), Cherry parses nature in terms of "whether the universe is a cosmos -- that is, whether it is ordered" (37). On his account, nature in Aristotle thus signifies the distinct natures of individual beings separately and/or aggregated as "the order of nature." It also, and not identically, signifies a cosmic whole in which the various natures of beings and organisms are ordered hierarchically (67). It is nature in the second sense that Cherry takes to be hospitable to humankind, and hence to serve as the "guide" (205) of human life and the ground of Aristotle's vision of a politics oriented to human flourishing and the good.

There is for Aristotle, to be sure, a cosmos that is made up of beings and organisms with natures (67) but it is not clear that there is a cosmic nature in addition to distinct individual natures. Aristotle may seem to refer to something like a cosmic nature when he says things like "nature makes nothing without a purpose" (Politics 1256b20). But we may not need more than an account of the distinct natures of particular beings and the first-order capacities or potentialities those beings are born with (De anima 2.5) to make sense of, say, the gift of logos and "the unique capacity for deliberating about the just and the advantageous" (61, 66) that belong to beings that are human.

By attenuating the possibility of referring individual natures, human or otherwise, to an apolitical cosmic whole or a pre-political "state of nature," taking there to be only natures, but no nature as such, in Aristotle may give additional content to Cherry's contrast between Aristotle, on the one hand, and the Eleatic Stranger and some modern political theorists, on the other. It may also, and somewhat paradoxically, add force to what Cherry (in chapter six)  calls his "gestures" to Aristotle's ongoing relevance to contemporary discussions of environmentalism, specifically those that reach beyond a strictly humanist perspective. If human interactions with other beings and organisms are guided not by a cosmic order that grants human beings their distinctive capacities but are instead guided by the particular natures of these self-same human and nonhuman beings, which alter and are altered in interaction, then relations with and among nonhuman beings become no less important to a flourishing political life than are relations among human beings.