Plato in Germany: Kant -- Natorp -- Heidegger

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Alan Kim, Plato in Germany: Kant -- Natorp -- Heidegger, Academia, 2010, 312pp., €59.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783896654946.

Reviewed by Catherine H. Zuckert, University of Notre Dame


Like Hans Georg Gadamer in his Philosophical Apprenticeships, Alan Kim suggests that we will understand Heidegger's thought better if we know more about his debates with his colleagues at the University of Marburg. In particular, Kim contends that we will not truly understand Heidegger until we understand the position Heidegger was most immediately and directly critiquing in his interpretation of Plato -- that taken by Paul Natorp in his Platos Ideenlehre.

Because Natorp was a "Neo-Kantian" philosopher, Kim begins with a brief account of Kant's understanding of the relation between his conception of the "ideas" and those of Plato. There appears to be a loose correspondence between the distinction Plato draws between the intelligible and the sensible and that Kant famously draws between the noumenal and the phenomenal. Kant himself points to the connection in his Dissertation, where he distinguishes between an empirical (a posteriori) or "sensual" and a non-empirical (a priori) or "intelligent" source of cognition. By the time he writes the Critique of Pure Reason, however, Kant has come to see that

the ideai, when properly understood, are limit-concepts of perfection and completeness. Perfection is not met with in experience, so the ideai must be a priori. But since perfection is not 'constitutive' of experience, the ideai must also lie beyond the categories of the understanding: they are concepts of pure reason that guide or 'regulate' both theoretical knowledge and practical reasoning. Because, in Kant's view, Plato himself misconstrued the epistemological function of the ideai, he was misled into ascribing to them a substantial existence (22).

To explain why later philosophers moved away from Kant and then returned to a modified version of his "transcendental method," in Chapter 2 Kim reminds his readers that the German idealists attempted to overcome the strict dichotomies Kant had drawn between the phenomenon and the noumenon, on the one hand, and sensibility and understanding, on the other. These efforts were not successful, however. Fichte did not provide a persuasive explanation of how his "absolute Ego" was related to empirical reality. Moreover, Hegel's system was discredited by the strongly anti-mathematical bias of his philosophy of nature. Empirical science alone appeared to retain a claim to constitute knowledge. Faced with the prospect of the reduction of philosophy to an empirical study of the human psychê, along the lines indicated by Hume and the Mills, philosophers in "the Marburg school" sought to preserve the autonomy of philosophy by insisting on its "critical" character. Following Kant, they maintained that the distinctive task of philosophy was not to generate knowledge, but to explain the conditions for the possibility of such. Unlike Kant, however, they did not seek to establish the conditions of the possibility of psychically empirical objects, but of the exact (mathematical) sciences. Like Fichte they argued that the categories and regulative principles of science were posited (ge-setzt) by an autonomous mind, the non-empirical, non-individual mind of the scientist qua scientist, employing scientific method. To explain the development of the positive sciences, the neo-Kantians also maintained that these laws or categories developed dialectically over time or in history. But in opposition to Hegel, they insisted that the process would never be complete.

In Chapter 3 Kim then uses arguments of other members of "the Marburg school" to elucidate "Natorp's Theories of Knowledge and History." He followed Herman Cohen's dictum: "Not the stars in the heavens are the objects which [the transcendental] method teaches us to contemplate in order to know them; rather, it is the astronomical calculations, those facts of scientific reality which are the 'actuality' that needs to be explained" (67). And he sympathized with Ernst Cassirer's critique of the "naïve" common sense realism shared by Aristotle and most practicing scientists "that a world of independently existent, real things is given to us" (73). On the contrary, the Marburgers maintained, the sensible world is a seamless flux that is ordered and determined as objects by scientific rationality in the form of laws. "The hypothesizing activity of thinking cannot occur in a random, haphazard way if it is to generate knowledge," however. An hypothesis must be

restricted and structured by other cognitions that, for the purpose of determining some given X, are taken as (provisionally) established… the link among these steps is the notion of justification, that is, showing how a given step flows without contradiction from a previous step (82-3).

As a consequence, in Marburg neo-Kantian philosophy

'being' takes on an exclusively functional meaning, namely the function of predication. It is nothing more than the copula in a true predication expressing a scientific judgment. It has the sole function of relating, of identifying, of connecting subject and predicate, thereby synthetically generating cognition. As a result, 'ontology' … is resolved into a logic of judgment (85).

No wonder Heidegger criticized the neo-Kantian reduction of 'being' to the 'copula' in his return to the question of the meaning of being!

Because 'science' changes over time, the Marburg school maintained, "philosophy, as philosophy of science, must also be the philosophical history of science" (93). Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer thus engaged in historical studies of Kant, Leibniz, Descartes, Copernicus, Galileo, Kepler -- and Plato. As the Marburgers saw it, "the history of science is one of often contradictory or incommensurable theories," but "as scientific -- the variety of theories express the central, unitary activity of reason: positing hypotheses" (94-5). Plato was not merely the founder; his dialogues expressed the core or essence of philosophy.

At the beginning of Chapter 4 readers learn that Natorp took up "Cohen's philosophical and historical intuitions and form[ed] them into an overarching interpretation of the Platonic theory of ideai" (99). In Platos Ideenlehre he showed how Plato's idealism developed in stages, growing from static concepts into static categories, finally producing the mature and infinitely fertile theory of functional hypotheses, the seeds of all genuine sciences. He ordered the Platonic dialogues accordingly, beginning with the confusion of poetry and philosophy in the Phaedrus, proceeding through Plato's turn to the epistemological question in the Theaetetus and the announcement of the (theory of the) ideas as an hypothesis in the Phaedo to attacking "the 'thing'-interpretation of the ideai" and working out of a "system of pure concepts" in the Parmenides and Sophist. Only at the end of this chapter does Kim explain that he has "gone into such detail regarding Natorp's equation of logos, judgment, and Aussage and the meaning of 'being' that flows from this equation because" he plans to show that "it forms the chief target of Heidegger's critique in the Sophist-lectures." In other words, he finally states the thesis of the book on p. 147!

In Chapter 5 Kim turns to consider the alternative understanding of the ideai as "forms" (eidê) rather than as "laws" (Gesetze) put forward by Edmund Husserl. Kim presents a very clear brief restatement of Husserl's argument concerning the need for and character of the "eidetic reduction" that stresses the intentional character of the objects of knowledge (or "ideas"). His intentional understanding of the ideas may bring Husserl closer to Plato's "ontological" conception than Natorp's laws, but Kim emphasizes the explicitly epistemological and scientific concerns Husserl shared with his colleague Natorp. Both were "attempting to found the a priori rules of thinking that makes the sciences possible as logical systems" and trying "to demonstrate the autonomy of mind." Heidegger could thus critique both in turning back from their epistemological studies of theoretical science to analyze the more "primordial" lived experience as "being-in-the world."

"While it is obvious that despite his disagreements Heidegger owes his basic inspiration to Husserl," Kim concludes, "the positive influence of Natorp has been mostly overlooked." That influence appears primarily in Heidegger's explication of Dasein's essential historicity by means of a "destructive" history of philosophy, featuring (as does Natorp's history) Kant, Descartes, and Plato. The thesis Kim develops "in Chapter Seven is that just as Natorp interprets Plato's thought as an autochthonous idealism, so Heidegger discerns there an aboriginal Phenomenology" (185).

Before he turns to his culminating contention that Heidegger developed his distinctive mode of thinking through his study of Plato's Sophist (although he never acknowledged it), Kim pauses in Chapter 6 to summarize a variety of literary reinterpretations of Plato that arose out of the conflict between the classical philologist, Ulrich von Wilamowitz-Moellendorff (1848-1933), and the poet Stefan George (1868-1933). This admittedly general survey is presumably designed to support the suggestion in the title of Kim's book that he will describe, if not explain, the prominence of Plato in late nineteenth- and early twentieth-century German thought -- poetic, philosophical, and political. Such a brief survey is obviously inadequate to the task, as is Kim's earlier abbreviated discussion of the work of one of the central characters in the story of the German re-appropriations of Plato, Friedrich Schleiermacher.

Having spent so much time and space explicating the "context" or background of Heidegger's reinterpretation of Plato, Kim does not leave himself enough of either in Chapter 7 to demonstrate or thoroughly document his twin theses, that Heidegger develops his distinctive brand of phenomenology through his study of Plato's Sophist and that Heidegger's reading of Plato, especially of the Republic, needs to be understood in contrast to Natorp's. He can only give brief indications or pieces of both arguments. He whets the reader's appetite, however, with his excellent account of Heidegger's interpretation of logos as Rede and the way that understanding is constituted in speech.

Plato in Germany is, unfortunately, a classic case of the trees obstructing the view of the forest. In this book Kim displays great erudition and intelligence, but the overall "through-line" indicated by the sub-title gets buried in the details. The problem, however, is not simply that Kim seems to have thought that he could justify his central claim about the importance of Natorp for Heidegger only by presenting it in the context of the broader story of "Plato in Germany." As Kim states at the beginning, "Kant's philosophy is the root of all later German controversies regarding the Platonic forms" (22). But, as Kim also reports, Kant identified a fundamental difference between his brand of "idealism" and Plato's. Although he explicitly identifies the "transcendental" concern with the conditions for the possibility of knowledge in Heidegger (181) as well as in Natorp and Husserl, Kim seems in the end, like Natorp, to want to amalgamate (neo-)Kantian idealism with Plato. He seems thereby to ignore the fundamental difference between pre- and post-Cartesian "idealism."