Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life

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Daniel C. Russell, Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life, Oxford University Press, 2005, 340pp, $68.62 (hbk), ISBN 0199282846.

Reviewed by David Wolfsdorf, Temple University


Those engaged in Plato's ethics and the current renaissance of Greco-Roman virtue-ethics will welcome Daniel C. Russell's Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life, professedly the first examination of Plato's treatment of pleasure and its relation to virtue and happiness throughout the corpus in at least fifty years. As Russell notes, Jussi Tenkku's The Evaluation of Pleasure in Plato's Ethics, Acta Philosophica Fennica, 11, 1956, is groundbreaking, but, at least among Anglophones, rarely cited. More recently, George Rudebusch's inquiry into Plato's treatment of pleasure and goodness, Socrates, Pleasure, and Value, Oxford University Press, 1999, is confined to the early dialogues, above all Protagoras and Gorgias. J. C. B. Gosling and C. C. W. Taylor's The Greeks on Pleasure, Oxford University Press, 1982, also deserves mention for its consideration of pleasure in Plato, among others. While Gosling and Taylor argue that Plato's treatment of pleasure is disunified, the gist of Russell's book is that Plato's treatment is unified throughout the corpus.

The introduction to Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life lays some basic conceptual ground. Russell swiftly moves from pleasure to emotion to value to ethics. He distinguishes pleasure as sensation from pleasure as emotion, where the latter is a content-ful intentional state. Pleasures as emotions entail attitudes, priorities, and values; and so the pleasures we have reveal the persons we are. Ultimately, insofar as humans seek integrated lives, pleasure relates to happiness, life's telos. This is why, as Russell's chapter-subtitle puts it, "pleasure matters". In sum, precisely what place pleasure should have in a good life is an important ethical question, and, as Russell writes, Plato "has much to offer us that is new, both for understanding fresh possibilities for thinking of pleasure as part of the good life, and for appreciating the implications that these possibilities have for -- and the demands they place on -- other areas of moral philosophy and psychology." (13)

What place, then, does pleasure have in Plato's good life? In brief, virtue, which is identical to wisdom or practical reason, is the only unconditional good. Pleasure, among other things, is a conditional good that the virtuous person rationally incorporates into his life. In Russell's own words: "To put things most succinctly, I argue in this book that Plato regards pleasure as a conditional good, the goodness of which depends on, and is given by, the role that pleasure takes on in a virtuous character under the leadership of practical intelligence." (9)

The defense of this thesis mainly occurs in chapters 1, 2, 3, 4, and 6. Chapter 1 focuses on the distinction between unconditional and conditional goods in Euthydemus; and chapters 2, 3, 4, and 6 defend the view that for Plato pleasure is a conditional good in Gorgias, Phaedo, Republic IV and IX, and Philebus respectively. Chapter 7 closes the main argument of the book by examining a problem in Plato's psychology relevant to pleasure's relation to virtue. Specifically, Russell argues that above all in Republic Plato operates with two models of the relation between our rational and our affective natures. On one model, the so-called agreement model, "our affective nature is sufficiently able to grasp and adopt the direction that our rational nature [ideally, virtue or wisdom] gives it, so that these natures can work together in cooperation" (12). But Plato also operates with another, so-called control model. In this case, our affective nature lacks the capacity for agreement; it must be checked, tamed, and controlled by the force of reason. One thinks here particularly of the charioteer in the Phaedrus. Beyond the obvious difficulty of two inconsistent psychological models, the control model sits ill with the view of pleasure as a conditional good that can be rationally incorporated into one's life: "the tension within the psychological account of Plato's Republic reveals what sorts of problems we must surmount in order to sustain a promising analysis of the rational incorporation of pleasure" (219).

Chapters 5 and 8 are based on two of Russell's articles, "Virtue as 'Likeness to God' in Plato and Seneca", Journal of the History of Philosophy 42 (2004) 241-60 and "Protagoras and Socrates on Courage and Pleasure: Protagoras 349d ad finem", Ancient Philosophy 20 (2000) 311-38, respectively. Chapter 5 examines the pursuit of virtue as assimilation to divinity and in doing so addresses the apparent tension between worldliness and otherworldliness in Platonic ethics. Russell argues that Plato does not reject the terrestrial and endorse asceticism, but claims that we "are like God in so far as we follow intelligent principles to bring 'matter' -- in our case, our very selves -- into an orderly whole." (149) Thus, "humans seek likeness to God by seeking wisdom, but we seek likeness to God not as gods, but as the humans that we are" (148). This view, consequently, leaves room for pleasure of a certain kind in a well-lived human life.

Finally, chapter 8, which serves as an epilogue, argues against a hedonistic interpretation of aspects of the final argument for the identification of courage and knowledge in Protagoras. Hedonistic interpretations -- for example, Gosling and Taylor's as well as Irwin's -- obviously threaten the unity of Russell's account. I think Russell is quite right in rejecting them.

Note that those interested in Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life, who seek a succinct overview beyond the one I have just given, will find it spelled out with admirable clarity on pages 9-13 of Russell's book. Generally speaking, the book is well written, clear, insightful, and recommended. In my opinion, its greatest strength is the sophistication of the conceptual framework in terms of which it approaches its chosen ethical and moral psychological topics. This itself is a testament to the increasing maturation of scholarship on ancient virtue-ethics. And since Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life is Russell's first book, one has the impression that he promises to play a leading role in further developments. Having said this, and with no intention to diminish the valuable contribution that Russell has made, I devote the remainder of this review to a set of critical questions and comments.

The conceptual heart of the book is chapter 1. Fundamental here are two distinctions, first between additive and directive conceptions of happiness and second between unconditional and conditional goods. According to the first distinction, on one view, happiness depends upon a set of "ingredients added to one's life"; on another view, happiness depends upon "the intelligent agency that gives one's life the direction it needs to be healthy and flourishing" (17). According to the second distinction -- informed by Korsgaard's distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic goods (versus final and instrumental goods) -- the goodness of unconditional goods "is not conditioned by something else's bringing goodness about in them, but they are responsible for bringing about goodness in other things." In contrast, conditional goods "have goodness brought about in them by unconditional goods" (23).

The basic argument of chapter 1, then, is that at Euthydemus 278e-282a in particular, Socrates develops a directive conception of happiness and argues that wisdom (= virtue) is the only unconditional good. This account of the Euthydemus argument subsequently leads to the question of the role that pleasure plays in happiness; and Russell uses the groundwork here laid to examine this question in subsequent chapters on pertinent dialogues of the early, middle, and late periods.

The Euthydemus argument has for several decades now been recognized as important for the appreciation of Platonic ethics, at least among the early dialogues. It also appears to have been an important argument for the Stoics. This turns out to be significant, for Russell's treatment of Plato on virtue, happiness, and pleasure tends to paint Plato as a proto-Stoic. Indeed, Russell's Stoic reading of Plato echoes various Stoic-like treatments by Julia Annas, which is also not coincidental since Russell was a student of Annas. Here it must be noted that Annas' influence on Plato on Pleasure and the Good Life is deep and ubiquitous.

But precisely how the Euthydemus argument is to be interpreted is a matter of much controversy. My present understanding is influenced by a recent treatment of Panos Dimas, "Happiness in the Euthydemus", Phronesis 47 (2002) 1-27. It will be instructive to compare what Dimas and Russell have to say. Dimas argues that wisdom is the only good and that scholars mischaracterize health, wealth, and so on as conditional goods, since these may just as well be considered conditional bad things. Instead, Dimas argues that they are "facilitators"; they facilitate the exercise of wisdom (or vice for that matter). For this reason, facilitators are more harmful when the agent lacks wisdom than when the agent who lacks wisdom lacks them as well. Accordingly, Socrates asks: "Would not a man do less wrong if he did less?" (281c)

In a footnote (37, p. 27) Russell criticizes Dimas for trying to "have it both ways", that is, for availing himself of both directive and additive conceptions of happiness. According to Russell, Dimas' view of wisdom as the only good conforms to the directive conception; however, Dimas' view of health, wealth, and so on as facilitators entails the additive view. In considering this criticism of Russell, we ought also to raise the question of the relation between virtue or wisdom and happiness. Here I find Russell's views inadequately clear. In the Euthydemus argument, Socrates considers the relation between wisdom and success. Russell writes that "success consists in the very exercise of wisdom" (30) and that "success is determined not by the completion of some action, but by how one engages in all action with wisdom and intelligence" (31). But Russell also writes that "wisdom is the same as success" (42). Here I find an obfuscation of the distinction between the state of wisdom and the exercise of wisdom. Yet I regard this distinction as Platonic. For example in Charmides and Republic I, Plato distinguishes between a dunamis or power and the ergon or product (in Charmides) or activity (in Republic I) that the dunamis realizes. My understanding is that wisdom or virtue is to happiness as dunamis is to ergon. Indeed, this emerges in Euthydemus itself; Socrates asks: "Would a thing be beneficial if we only had it, but did not use it?" Here Socrates specifically has in mind putative goods such as health, wealth, and so on; and admittedly, there is a distinction between these and wisdom insofar as their benefit depends upon their use by wisdom, whereas wisdom itself is not used by anything. Nonetheless, it remains true that the state of wisdom is distinguishable from the exercise of wisdom.

This is important for understanding the relation between virtue and happiness and specifically between Russell's unconditional and conditional goods. According to Russell, health, for example, is a conditional good; this, because the health of, say, a vicious man is not a good thing. But if so, then why isn't the sickness of a virtuous man a conditional good? The virtuous man will have the right sort of attitude toward his sickness and will wisely incorporate his sickness into his life. Indeed, it seems that anything had by a virtuous or wise person will be a conditional good.

Now if this is not the case, but instead health has the potential to be a conditional good, whereas sickness lacks that potential, then health, and other potential conditional goods must have some intrinsic characteristic(s) in virtue of which they, as opposed to their contraries, are potential conditional goods. But if they do have such characteristics, then those characteristics will be valuable, granted not unconditionally valuable, but valuable nonetheless. Returning at last to Dimas, I am compelled to believe that such value is the value of a facilitator.

Furthermore -- and this is not a problem that Dimas raises, but which emerges from Dimas' position as well as Russell's -- if wisdom is a state and happiness is the exercise of wisdom, then wisdom depends upon conditions under which it can be exercised. For example, one cannot perform physical actions that are virtuous if one is physically impaired. In that case, virtue depends for its exercise on the obtaining of other conditions. In other words, happiness depends on conditions other than virtue obtaining.

To these difficulties -- which may well be Platonic, but which if so, still ought to be identified and considered -- several others should be added. One is that elsewhere in Plato, for example in Republic I, Socrates cites health, as a good, precisely as the aretê of the body, just as justice is the aretê of the soul. Similarly, he speaks of sight, that is, the capacity to see, as the aretê of the eyes. In short, an aretê emerges as a condition that enables its appropriate bearer, be it the soul, body, or specifically the eyes, to perform its appropriate function. Indeed, Socrates uses this function argument -- an argument, mind you, that is central to Russell's account (see 119ff. and 162ff. in particular) -- to defend the view that the life of a just man is stronger, more profitable, and more conducive to happiness than that of an unjust man. I draw attention to this argument as one significant place in the corpus where Plato or rather Socrates appears to be conceptualizing goods differently from the way goods are conceptualized in the Euthydemus passage.

In relation to this problem, I'd like to make a comment on Russell's treatment of Socrates on true pleasures in Philebus. Admittedly, Philebus is, at least temporally, at least three decades away from Euthydemus. But since Russell's thesis is that Plato's conception is unified, we are permitted to bring it into contact with the Euthydemus argument. According to Russell, true pleasures in Philebus are pleasures that involve accurate apprehension of the objective value of things. Observe that Russell here speaks of beauty in the main, but he also speaks of other valuables (196). Now it is not clear whether objective value and intrinsic value are coextensive. But Russell appears to be referring to unconditional goods, which are not identical to wisdom. If so, then obviously we have a problem. If not, then Russell's discussion might benefit from some clarification.

Another question I have relates to an article by Gerasimos Santas, "Socratic Goods and Socratic Happiness", Apeiron 26 (1993) 37-52. Oddly, Russell does not cite the piece. In fact, this is especially odd since it immediately precedes Julia Annas' "Virtue as the Use of Other Goods" in the same volume of Apeiron; and the Annas article is crucial for Russell's interpretation of the Euthydemus passage. For his part, Santas argues that among the early dialogues, happiness and virtue are, problematically, circularly inter-defined. Virtue is the psychological power whose exercise yields happiness, while happiness is living virtuously. It is a virtue of Santas' paper that he fixes on this problem; and it is a problem of Russell's discussion that he never brings the concept of happiness out into the open and attempts a substantive definition or at least clarification of it. Throughout, he relies on some perhaps substantive, yet always intuitive conception. This is unsatisfying. Indeed, the problem may ultimately be Platonic, as Santas would claim -- at least among the early dialogues. But there is a difficulty here that needs closer attention.

Another question concerns the relation between pleasure qua conditional good on Russell's account and, again, let us use, health as a conditional good. In the Euthydemus argument no mention is made of pleasure as a putative or conventional good. Thus, it does not explicitly follow from the Euthydemus argument that pleasure, like health or wealth, becomes good when it is governed by wisdom or rather is incorporated into a life of wisdom. True pleasure qua emotion, as Russell understands it, is something different; it is the attitude that the wise person adopts towards objects of value or adopts in view of the virtuous conduct of his life as a whole. Let us allow that in, say, Philebus such a conception of pleasure emerges. Even so, it is questionable whether the Euthydemus argument genuinely serves as the springboard to such a conception. Might the roots of such a conception not more appropriately, or at least also, lie elsewhere, for example, in the representationalism that is introduced in Theaetetus, or perhaps earlier in representational conceptions of desire among the early dialogues?

Finally, let me note that there is another passage among the early dialogues, Meno 87b-89c, which develops a similar argument to that in Euthydemus. I was surprised to find the Meno passage unmentioned.

What does all this mean for Russell's discussion? Basically it means that the Platonic picture is more complicated than the Euthydemus argument suggests. Indeed, I think it is rather too bold to prop one's manuscript on a set of distinctions -- whether rightly or wrongly interpreted -- that are derived from one argument in one dialogue. To this Russell may justly protest that the chapter on Euthydemus does not function in this way; the expository purpose in the treatment of the Euthydemus argument is to introduce conceptual points that are maintained and cultivated elsewhere. Perhaps. But at the very least, there are other important passages in the corpus where the distinctions we find in Euthydemus appear to be contradicted or at least complicated.

Let us now briefly move to Russell's discussion of Gorgias and Phaedo. Russell is, not only, but mainly, responding to the ostensible anti-hedonism of the dialogues. In one respect this presents no problem for his thesis, since Russell explicitly argues that Plato does not endorse hedonism. But anti-hedonism is stronger than a denial of hedonism. In Gorgias and Phaedo, Socrates arguably maintains that pleasure is a bad thing. Russell's task is, therefore, to show that these texts are consistent with a Socratic endorsement of pleasure as a conditional good.

Frankly, I don't see this working. Recall the distinction between pleasure as sensation and pleasure as emotion. Russell's position here is that the contents of Gorgias and Phaedo are consistent with a conception of pleasure qua emotion as a conditional good. Now this may well be true, but consistency does not imply relevance. Such truth, if truth it is, seems tangential or even tendentious when we consider the treatment of pleasure in these dialogues. I would argue that in the texts, the kind of pleasure with which Socrates is concerned is pleasure as sensation. This is particularly pronounced in Gorgias where Socrates speaks of pleasure as a semblance of goodness and compels Callicles to admit that his hedonism implies the goodness of the catamite's life. Of course, Russell has arguments to combat my position. But I do not find them to be compelling arguments. For example, in regard to Phaedo Russell draws attention to the joy with which Socrates conducts the final arguments of his philosophical life; Russell, therefore, wonders how the dialogue can withhold a place for pleasure in a valuable human life. The problem is that hedonê here and in Gorgias does not refer to such a thing as Socrates' joy.

My point, I hope, is not simply a semantic one. It has to do with the various foci of the various dialogues. That is why I grant that Russell's conception of pleasure as a conditional good may well be consistent with Gorgias and Phaedo. But to argue for this seems to me to ignore the real point of the treatments of hedonê in these texts. Russell's position is strongest when he turns to Philebus. There we find explicit and clear evidence that pleasure is psychological, not merely physical. Moreover, Russell does a fine job of showing how, in his discussion of various false pleasures, Socrates is developing the idea that pleasure is an intentional state. But to read such content back into or out of Gorgias and Phaedo does an injustice to the interests and objectives of those texts.

Ultimately, I think the real problem comes down to the fundamental way we approach the Platonic dialogues. One might read Russell without ever having read Plato and, aside from the formally dialogic passages employed as evidence in Russell's arguments, walk away thinking that Plato wrote ethical treatises. The problem is that Plato's texts present the interpreter with unique difficulties; and Russell's unified conception of pleasure, virtue, and happiness throughout the corpus obscures and indeed has to suppress the diversity of agendas of Plato's individual writings.

In this respect, Russell's contribution is consistent with much Anglophone philosophical scholarship on Plato. Yet over the last decade in particular there has also been a shift in this tendency, specifically toward a greater appreciation of the literary and dramatic dimensions of the dialogues. This trend need not and indeed must not diminish the philosophical and more specifically argumentative content of the dialogues. But what it clearly does do is underscore that accounts of the philosophical content of the dialogues must reflect the dialogic and dramatic character of the texts.

One further general point is worth mentioning. This has to do with the notion of a comprehensive treatment of Plato on pleasure, which Russell explicitly sets out to achieve. It seems to me that such an ambition cannot dispense with treatments of pleasure by other Socratics, specifically Antisthenes, Aristippus and the Cyrenaics, and Xenophon -- to say nothing of popular Greek or Athenian attitudes. Since the publication of Giannantoni's collected fragments of the Socratics there has been a growing literature on the so-called minor Socratics. Indeed, there are a number of searching inquiries into the relation between Aristippus and Antisthenes and the Cyrenaics and Cynics, particularly insofar as they seem to present diametrically opposed reactions to pleasure. The question has been: how can these individuals and schools be reconciled as stemming from a common Socratic source? Most attempts seek reconciliation by diminishing Antisthenes' anti-hedonism and Aristippus' hedonism for an attitude toward virtue and pleasure not unlike the one Russell elaborates in his book. There may, however, be another way to resolve the problem, and that is to view Socrates as engaged in the nomos-phusis debate of his Sophistic contemporaries. As such, we might envision Socrates as pursuing the true nature of humanity. This idea at least gains plausibility when one juxtaposes Plato's Socrates, on the one hand, and Callicles and Thrasymachus, on the other. If so, then Aristippus and Antisthenes might be explained as Socratics insofar as their hedonism and anti-hedonism respectively are two, indeed opposed, answers to a common question: what is a human being really, and what is the human good?