Plato on the Rhetoric of Philosophers and Sophists

Placeholder book cover

Marina McCoy, Plato on the Rhetoric of Philosophers and Sophists, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 212pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521878630.

Reviewed by Eugene Garver, Saint John's University


Marina McCoy's book has a simple thesis: "Plato distinguishes Socrates from the sophists by differences in character and moral intention" (p. 1). She immediately notes two complications. First, there is no simple way of separating Socrates from the sophists, and the drama of several of the dialogues consists in exploring that complexity, as characters, not excluding Socrates, find the difference between Socrates and the sophists difficult to make out. So saying that Plato distinguishes Socrates from the sophists by their respective characters doesn't solve the problem; it instead tells us how to look at it. Second, McCoy's thesis has a polemical edge; it denies the claims of many commentators who think there is a difference between Socratic and sophistic method. Instead of distinguishing philosophy from sophistic, Plato, she thinks, is at pains to distinguish the philosopher from the sophist. The payoff from her thesis is in insightful readings of several of the dialogues. I will note some of those insights, and then raise a couple of problems with the book.

A natural place to describe and evaluate a person's character is a judicial trial, especially a Greek one with its looser rules of evidence in which the person is on trial, not merely for a particular crime but, as Socrates makes clear, for his life. Therefore McCoy first turns to the Apology and asks why Plato's presentation should bear such a striking resemblance to Gorgias' Defense of Palamades, especially since the Apology is a defense against charges that Socrates is himself a sophist; if the jury heard echoes of Gorgias, they would be more likely to believe the charge that Socrates is a sophist. While Socrates draws sharp distinctions between himself and the sophists -- they claim to teach while he denies that he does; they take money while he is poor; they introduce novel ideas while he doesn't -- he also uses rhetorical means of persuasion that he not only shares with the sophists but which must remind his audience of sophistic performances. His purpose is not only to be found innocent of the charges, and so seen as distinct from the sophists, but to defend the activity of philosophizing by reorienting the standard rhetorical topoi and devices. Philosophy is not distinct from sophistic because philosophy is anti-rhetorical, but because its use of rhetoric is ethically informed. For example, "Probability argument is elevated from a demonstration of the defendant's lack of means to commit a crime to an admission of an existential 'lack' that is common to all human beings" (43), the universal lack of knowledge. "While the predisposition of the jury is to identify philosophy with the overturning of traditional Greek virtues, Socrates attempts to heal the rift between virtue and philosophy. Socrates uses êthopoiia to build up not only his own virtue but also a new ideal of virtue itself" (44-45), trying to persuade the jury that his actions were indeed courageous and just by their own standards, although they wouldn't initially think so. In this way Socrates' defense speech can aim not only at persuading the jurors but at inviting them too to participate in the quest for self-knowledge that is Socrates' mission. However, McCoy thinks that "Socrates admits his own ignorance in the apparent hope that members of his audience will imitate him and also admit theirs" (43). Not only is this hope not realized, but there seems to be no rational basis for Socrates to hold it. There should be a stronger connection between Socrates' life and his intended effect on others.

When she looks next at the Protagoras, McCoy again sees Socrates overcoming sophistic rhetoric not by speaking in an unrhetorical way but by transforming rhetoric. The confrontation between Protagoras and Socrates is not between a sophist using rhetoric and a philosopher eschewing it. For example, "the traditional rhetorician's distinction between speaker and audience is not absolute: the speaker at one moment might become the audience in the next" (83). She nicely shows how Socrates' questions, such as that of the unity of the virtues, aim both at drawing consequences from Protagoras' assertions and at redirecting the conversation towards Socrates' own concerns; the same holds for the questions about hedonism and the art of measurement. Breaking down the distinction between speaker and audience is not merely rhetorical and dramatic, but a case of substantive progress. Drawing implications from Protagoras' claims is not merely hypothetical and ad hominem. Socrates and Protagoras change positions not just as speaker and hearer, but as first one and then the other asserts and denies that virtue is knowledge. Protagoras seems to me neither fully cooperative with Socrates nor as grudging an interlocutor as Callicles or Thrasymachus, and McCoy's analysis could go on to explain how this dialogue is fully neither irenic nor polemical. I would like McCoy to show how in her view Socrates' rhetorical performance either is or is not successful: does either Protagoras or the reader learn anything, or is either persuaded of anything by Socrates? Similarly, she says that those who see Socrates as philosophical or rational and therefore anti-rhetorical see him as the 'winner' of the dialogue (58). What happens to that idea with her more nuanced sense of rhetoric?

In a strong chapter on the Gorigas, she shows how Socrates not only refutes sophistic speech and the sophistic way of life, but is self-critical towards philosophical speech and life. She focuses

upon three different distinctions made between philosophy and rhetoric: (1) the contrast between art (technê) and rhetoric in the dispute with Gorgias; (2) the emphasis placed upon reliance on one's own beliefs in the section with Polus; and (3) the description of philosophy as unchanging and rhetoric as changing in the section with Callicles. (86)

Simply refuting the sophists is too easy a victory; Plato has to show why "the rhetorical standpoint is powerful despite being anti-philosophical" (86) and intellectually incoherent. A logical refutation that leaves one's interlocutors unpersuaded is a failure by the ethical standards of Socrates the philosopher.

Her next chapter, on the Republic, shows why the philosopher and sophist are so hard to distinguish.

Plato differentiates [the sophist and the philosopher] by the philosopher's love of the forms and his possession of moral and intellectual virtues. However, because sophists do not even acknowledge that the forms exist, the philosopher is separable from the sophist only from the viewpoint of the philosopher. From the sophist's viewpoint, a philosopher is merely a deficient sophist. (111)

In keeping with the main thesis that the difference between philosophy and sophistic is ethical, she says that "Plato's emphasis in the Republic is upon desire rather than knowledge as the distinguishing mark of the philosopher" (118). In spite of the image of the divided line, philosophers cannot be marked off from other people by what they know, but by how they live. There are no philosophers in the city of pigs; "the idea of the 'philosopher' first arises in the city in relation to the need for the guardians to be both spirited and gentle" (118). The city of pigs is too simple to contain philosophers, or sophists, for that matter. The philosophic nature arises only in the right conditions, and develops via the discovery that the successful guardian must know what justice is to act justly. It turns out that virtue requires more and more rigorous forms of knowledge, which accounts for the turns the argument takes in the Republic.

McCoy examines the Sophist partly by comparison to the Theaetetus.

Plato engages his audience in a reflection upon the nature of philosophy through the contrast between Socrates' and the Stranger's ways of speaking … . I argue that the Eleatic Stranger is deliberately presented as an enigmatic figure who may alternately be identified as either a sophist or a philosopher. (139)

"While Socrates' discourse is informed by his character, the Stranger is peculiarly absent from his own discourse" (141); we know almost nothing about who he is, and his character seems to have nothing to do with his discourse. At the beginning of the book McCoy quotes Aristotle's Rhetoric saying that what makes the sophist "is not his faculty, but his moral purpose (prohairesis)" (1355b17-18). In her treatment of the Sophist she might have referred to a line from later in the Rhetoric:

Mathematical works do not have an êthos because they do not show deliberative choice (prohairesis) (for they do not have a purpose (to heneka)), but the Socratic dialogues do (for they speak of such things). (III.15.1417a19-21)

This has always seemed to me a blatant fallacy: just because something is about ethical matters doesn't make the discourse itself ethical, just as work about boredom need not itself be boring. The Stranger, at least compared to Socrates, seems to lack êthos while talking about ethical matters, which produces some of the oddities of the dialogue. As McCoy herself puts it:

The Stranger's divisions do not easily lend themselves to asking normative questions about the sophist's activity… . While the metaphysical sections of the dialogue delve deeply into the question of being, they do not address the moral or political problems attached to false appearances. (149)

While up to here the project of separating the philosopher from the sophist means comparing Socrates to various sophists, the Sophist, especially alongside the Theaetetus, makes the story much more complex since we now have two very different, and apparently incompatible, examples of the philosopher, one in which philosophy depends on character, virtue, having the right desires and eros, and the other in which philosophy is a matter of technique. For me, McCoy’s chapter on the Sophist was the climax and high point of the book. Before it, things had gone relatively smoothly, with McCoy showing how fruitful it is to read the dialogues in terms of Socrates the exemplar of philosophical character, and the uses of rhetoric to develop his character. But in her chapter on the Sophist all that is called into question. Once there are two contrasting representations of the character of the philosopher -- and the two couldn't be more different -- I wonder what happens to such things as the contrasts between the two ways of life in Socrates' discussion with Callicles. The Stranger seems even more ill-equipped than Socrates to fit the role of the philosopher-king in the Republic. (Maybe a further exploration of the Statesman could be helpful here.) Civic allegiances seem part of Socrates' philosophical character, but absent from the Stranger. It's hard to picture the Stranger being accused of corrupting the young; Meletus wouldn't have found him threatening, or thought he could make his name by prosecuting him. Such questions result from taking seriously McCoy's chapter on the Sophist.

However, the book has one more chapter, on the Phaedrus. As the Protagoras showed that in philosophy, unlike sophistic, the speaker and the audience can exchange positions, so the Phaedrus shows the same for the lover and the beloved:

While Phaedrus may have viewed Socrates only as an audience for Lysias' speech, the speech of the non-lover opens up the possibility of becoming Socrates' audience. Socrates puts himself in the position of Lysias as both an orator and a lover to Phaedrus, allowing Phaedrus to become receptive to listening to Socrates. (180)

Throughout the dialogue, McCoy sees Socratic speech as neither non-rhetorical demonstration nor mere persuasion: "Socrates' rhetoric is in between the presentation of secure and complete knowledge and the presentation of ideas that do not even intend to reveal a truth outside of the speaker" (183). This situation of philosophic discourse makes it "erotic rhetoric": "It is erotic not only in how it leads the soul of the audience toward the forms but also erotic insofar as the rhetorician himself admits to being in motion, in love with -- but not in total possession of -- knowledge of the forms" (183). Once again McCoy uses the ethical nature of the philosopher to criticize attempts to delineate philosophy as a kind of method:

If we take Socrates' idea in the Palinode that the distinctive essence of the philosophical soul is that it seeks the forms, then division and collection cannot be the only way in which good philosophy is practiced. Instead, any way of speaking that leads the soul to seek the forms and increases its desire to pursue them rather than other, lower goods, counts as philosophical rhetoric. (190)

While of course one can quarrel with some of the details of McCoy's readings, I want instead to invite her to pursue her research project further by raising two questions. First, it isn't only that commentators have wrongly seen the difference between philosophy and sophistic in terms of method; the dialogues themselves make just such distinctions, as we just saw for the Phaedrus. Socrates claims in the Protagoras that the sophist makes long speeches while he engages in question and answer (and then of course goes on to give the longest speech in the dialogue). The Phaedrus has philosophers cutting at the joints in their divisions, and the Stranger in the Sophist advocates a different sort of method of division as the method of philosophy, and there is something called dialectic supposedly at work in the Republic. If those distinctions ultimately fail, McCoy owes us an explanation of why Plato should dramatize people, not excluding Socrates himself, offering them.

Second, there are a number of ethical distinctions between the philosopher and the sophist which fail in just the same way that separating them by characteristic methods fails. Socrates doesn't take money, as the sophists do, and doesn't seek out pupils but will talk with anyone. Sophists aim at victory, while Socrates is happy to be refuted and aims at knowledge. None of these distinctions provides a sure test for the philosopher. There are no sure tests. True ethical distinctions must always be contestable, because they are interpersonal and not simply personal, and so one cannot judge the character of someone as something that exists apart from these interactions. Socrates aims at self-knowledge, but his means consist in conversations with other people, not introspection. "For Socrates, philosophical inquiry is by nature a social activity, spoken and not simply thought" (72). We are left with the character of Socrates, and any generalizations about the nature of philosophy or the philosopher from Socrates must be questionable. Moreover, the figure of the Stranger reminds us that Socrates is not the only possible philosopher. Plato the writer often seems to pursue two different aims, to memorialize Socrates and to use Socratic conversations as a way of articulating his own philosophic ideas. According to McCoy, Socratic êthopoiia is itself a high philosophic activity. If the lack of generalizations makes us return from McCoy's book to the dialogues themselves, this isn't a bad result.