Plato's Account of Falsehood: A Study of the Sophist

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Paolo Crivelli, Plato's Account of Falsehood: A Study of the Sophist, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 322pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521199131.

Reviewed by Naly Thaler, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


In Plato's Account of Falsehood Paolo Crivelli offers an interpretation of Plato's Sophist which culminates (as the book's title would suggest) in an interpretation of the discussion of false statements in 261ff, but also goes through most of the major puzzles and arguments leading to it. The book is written in the form of a running commentary, following the progression of the dialogue, and isolating passages for interpretation according to their place in the narrative. On the other hand, it nevertheless attempts to interpret earlier passages in a way which will be conducive to the interpretation of later ones, a feature which is not always characteristic of running commentaries. This approach seems to me fruitful, and in general serves the book well. What we get is a highly detailed and impressively rigorous analysis of each major argument in its turn and, at the same time, an attempt to tie these arguments together by allowing conclusions regarding an earlier argument to count as factors in determining the probable interpretation of later ones (and vice versa).

Crivelli professes to approach the text from the standpoint of analytic philosophy, to "ask Plato some of the questions that a modern philosopher of language would regard as important and . . . consider what answers Plato is committed to offering" (p. 11). This statement is liable to evoke in the reader an unwarranted fear of some blatant impending anachronism. The book does not begin with modern issues and then attempt to reconstruct, on the basis of textual evidence, what Plato's response to them would have been. Rather, it starts from a meticulously close reading of the Sophist's arguments (often incorporating detailed philological considerations), and attempts to reconstruct from them a coherent philosophical position which it then attributes to Plato.

The problem, well familiar to anyone working on ancient philosophy, is that sometimes the textual evidence for an ancient thinker's views and the demands of coherency do not converge. And it is in such cases that Crivelli clearly chooses to conform to the latter. This approach proves fruitful to varying degrees. Two examples might illustrate its rewards and detriments: in the closing section of the dialogue (261ff) Plato provides an analysis of false affirmative sentences. He does not however say what the corresponding analysis of false negative sentences is. Now, it is certainly no stretch of the imagination to suppose Plato did in fact have views on the latter unmentioned topic. Even if he did not, it seems that if his analysis of false affirmative sentences has any merit it should also be able, or at least should suggest how to account for, false negative sentences. Crivelli's interpretative approach, which allows him to reconstruct Plato's position, serves him and the reader well here. On the other hand, when dealing with the issue of negative kinds, and the question whether Plato is committed to the existence of a negative kind corresponding to each negative predicable (257c-d), Crivelli not only decides the issue on the basis of purely logical considerations, but ones that Plato would quite likely never have been aware of. The result is a position that is coherent but, as far as we know, might be opposed to the views of the historical Plato.

The bulk of the book is devoted to the presentation and evaluation of rival modern interpretations of different passages in the dialogue. Crivelli's method is to quote a piece of Plato's text (first in Greek and then in English translation), present contemporary rival categories of interpretation (usually four or five such categories for every passage, each representing the views of several different commentators), conduct a discussion and evaluation of each of them in turn and, finally, decide which seems most sound. By proceeding this way, Crivelli has created an indispensible tool for anyone doing serious work on the Sophist. The bulk of the modern literature on many cardinal passages in the dialogue is daunting, and one can only imagine the sort of effort that must have gone into Crivelli's cataloguing, categorizing, and finally, analysing of it.

The down side to this approach is that more than once it becomes difficult to be sure whether Crivelli is simply reporting about existing interpretations and expressing his views as to the relative merits of each, or whether he is also refining or adding to one of these views. At least partly, this stems from the fact that there is no indication of how the view of each commentator from among those Crivelli groups under a particular category of interpretation differs from those of other members of the same category. Because Crivelli's handling of the secondary literature takes it in the form of different types of interpretations, his own views are sometimes presented as falling into one of the various pre-existing types he has examined.

My last general comment about the book pertains to the relative scantiness of discussions that attempt to transcend the detailed analysis of each particular argument. Crivelli is not as forthcoming as one might have expected about spelling out the broader significance of his conclusions regarding various passages; and he completely refrains from speculation about things like 'underlying motivations', or 'overarching concerns'. This probably has to do with the general form of the running commentary. Since the book does not organize Plato's text around interpretative themes, but rather follows Plato's own presentation, there is no determinate point in the book's narrative in which such a discussion would have been organic. But since the book ultimately does strive to present a unified reading of many of the particular arguments, and is not intended to be read simply as a running commentary, there seems to have been room for spelling out what the significance of the common points of contact between various arguments is. It seems to me that the book would have greatly profited from a concluding chapter in which the many specific discoveries and insights amassed throughout the previous chapters had been brought together and examined for their common implications.

I shall now attempt to say something about several of the specific interpretative conclusions Crivelli presents in the book. The reader should be warned that I am being highly selective here. Not only can I not treat the breadth of Crivelli's interpretation as it deserves; even those issues which I raise for discussion cannot be dealt with in a way that begins to do justice to Crivelli's meticulous handling of them. I begin with the so called 'late learners', since their position is pivotal for understanding some of the main problems dealt with in the dialogue. These thinkers, Plato tells us, have a gripe with the usual practice of attributing in speech many properties to the same individual man, a practice here described as calling him by many names. The late learners are then reported to claim that it is impossible for one thing to be many, and for many to be one, and that we should not call man 'good' but rather say of (the) man 'man' and of (the) good 'good'. Crivelli interprets their position as involving confusion between two sorts of sentences: the first is meant to reveal the full essence of the item signified by the subject and is labelled a 'definitional' sentence; the second merely implies that the item signified by the subject instantiates the kind signified by the predicate and is referred to as 'ordinary'.

Since definitional sentences are only applicable to things which have natures and since, according to Crivelli, only kinds (as opposed to individuals) have natures, the distinction between sentences also implies a corresponding distinction between two categories of being, namely that of individuals and that of kinds. These complementing distinctions play a central role in Crivelli's interpretation of passages throughout the dialogue. For example, the distinction between definitional and ordinary sentences is, according to Crivelli, the key to understanding the puzzle in 250a-d about the relation of being to motion and rest, and is also central to a proper understanding of the various ways in which kinds do and do not combine (and of the general statement that it is impossible for all kinds to combine). It also appears in the analysis of the relation between negation and difference.

The ontological distinction, implied by the aforementioned linguistic one, between beings which have their own nature and those that do not is, according to Crivelli, brought to the fore in 255c13-14 which mentions the difference between things which are always said in relation to other things, and those that are said both in themselves and in relation to others. According to Crivelli, it is individuals who are always spoken of in relation to something different from them, which has its own nature, whereas kinds can be spoken about in relation to their own nature (through definitional sentences) or in relation to different kinds (via ordinary sentences).

When it comes to implementing the aforementioned distinctions in the interpretation of the analysis of false sentences in 261ff, Crivelli claims that the passage in 263d1-4, which gives a concise statement of what it is a false sentence actually says, makes two distinct claims: a false sentence says about something (a) that things different from it are identical to it, and (b) that things which are not about it, are. Crivelli takes the first claim to pertain to false definitional sentences which apply only to kinds, and the second to be about false ordinary sentences which are applicable to both individuals and kinds. This reading, which chimes well with Crivelli's previous insights, relies on a rather bold emendation to 263d1, unattested in any MS, which replaces 'you' (referring to Theaetetus) with 'something'.

I would like to conclude by raising a few questions about Crivelli's distinction between definitional and ordinary sentences. First, if I understand it correctly, the definitional category of sentences (described most fully in pp. 123-136 of the book) is somewhat misrepresented by its name. This is because, according to Crivelli, sentences that count as members in it are those whose predicate signifies a kind which is identical with the kind signified by their subject term. This means that many sentences in which the predicate term adds no additional informational value over that of the subject, such as 'difference is different', would still count as 'definitional'. On the other hand, while an informative sentence such as 'man is a two footed animal' would also count as a member, the sentence 'man is an animal' would not, because 'animal' does not signify the same kind as 'man'.

At least one problem with this way of parsing out kinds of sentences is that none of the problematic sentences in 255-256 whose appearance of inconsistency is meant to be relieved by the dichotomy between 'definitional' and 'ordinary' sentences are of the informative definitional sort, i.e. ones which identify two different descriptions of the same kind. So while Crivelli's specification of the nature of the 'definitional' category is consistent with what appears in the text, it also includes sentences whose complete absence from it might be significant and could count against his reading.

In addition, according to Crivelli, the distinction between definitional and ordinary sentences is meant to provide a solution to the problem posed by the late learners, whose difficulty lay in understanding how we can legitimately call one thing by many names. According to Crivelli's reading of their difficulty, the late learners recognize only definitional sentences, and do not accept ordinary predications either in regard to individuals or to kinds. But for this to be so, the late learners would have to be willing to countenance informative definitional sentences, such as 'man is a two-footed animal' which one might also describe as cases of 'calling one thing by many names'. In order for Crivelli's interpretation to work, the late learners would have to hold a relatively sophisticated view which distinguishes between two instances of 'calling one thing by many names', which would allow them to deny the viability of 'man is good' (regarding both individuals and kinds) and accept that of 'man is a two footed animal'. Their agreement to calling (the kind) man 'two footed-animal' would also have to be compatible with their failure to understand how we can call him either 'animal' or 'two footed' on their own.

The difficulty of seeing how the highly schematic description of the late learners' view (which, at least on the face of it, merely claims that each thing should be designated exclusively and consistently by one term) could entail all this is accentuated by the fact that we have evidence (in Aristotle's Metaphysics 1042b27-34, 1043b24-32) that for one of Plato's contemporaries, Antisthenes, the objection to using regular predications and the claim that there are no false statements came hand in hand with the denial that it is possible to produce definitions. So, regardless of whether or not one chooses to actually identify the late learners with Antisthenes (Crivelli seems to prefer the Platonic Euthydemus and Dionysodorus), there is historical evidence that thinkers who did not wish to call one thing by different names also objected to making informative definitional statements.

Perhaps additional support for Crivelli's distinction between sentences can be adduced from 232a where, after having produced several competing descriptions of the sophist, the visitor says that there is something wrong in calling a practitioner of a determinate art by many names instead of one. By this, the visitor might mean that it is wrong to define the same thing in different and incompatible ways or, in other words, to identify him with different kinds. Significantly, what would count as 'one name' in this criticism would have to be a complex definition (i.e. the proper one) which includes both genus and differentiae. If we take the visitor's statement as significant and indicative of what follows, it would constitute the first reference in the dialogue to a 'definitional' statement and would also, importantly, be of the 'informative' kind which is wholly missing from the later sections. In addition, it would provide further support for the idea that the late learners, who object to calling one thing by many names, actually accept sentences in which what is denoted by a single subject term is identified with a predicate expression consisting of a plurality of different terms.

In any event, these remarks do no more than scratch the surface of the discussion Crivelli's condensed and highly challenging book merits. In its combination of scope and rigour the book fills a significant gap in the modern literature on the Sophist. Crivelli has done the community of Platonic scholars a great service in writing it. It is sure to become a useful guide for anyone working on the dialogue, and a familiar reference in future discussions of it.