Plato's Anti-hedonism and the Protagoras

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J. Clerk Shaw, Plato's Anti-hedonism and the Protagoras, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 222pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107046658.

Reviewed by Vanessa de Harven, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


The title of this book is more clever than it first seems. There is a long-standing debate about whether Socrates espouses hedonism in the Protagoras, and J. Clerk Shaw does expertly adjudicate that matter in favor of an anti-hedonist stance. But that is just the first chapter. In fact, what he means by Plato's anti-hedonism goes well beyond the mechanics of Protagoras 351e ff., to Plato's indictment of hedonism across the corpus and the proper place of the Protagoras within that anti-hedonistic line of thought. Shaw offers an incisive diagnosis of popular double-think, as he calls it, which balances the incoherent complex of commitments to hedonism, to the possibility of akrasia and to the belief that injustice is prudent, i.e. in one's own self-interest to do. He offers detailed accounts of why the many think that justice is helping friends and harming enemies, that piety is an art of begging, and that all goods are competitive, spawning what he calls pleonectic alliances ("social groups that cooperate in prudent injustice . . . to get more competitive goods for the group and its members," 177) and false moralizing to hold it all together. So this turns out to be a book about the psychology of "the many," which is to say, most people, across the Platonic corpus, cloaked in an interpretive puzzle about the Protagoras.

Shaw's interpretative method is, as he puts it, ecumenical, aiming to be neutral with respect to chronology, development and unity, and the roles of literary analysis (8-9). He ranges widely in his analysis, drawing primarily from Protagoras, Gorgias, and Republic, but also from the Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Meno, and Philebus, and even stretching (less successfully, to my mind) to the Dissoi Logoi and the Pseudo-Platonic Definitions. This ecumenical approach is refreshing and welcome when so much commentary is so narrowly focused, although Shaw's unitarian sympathies do sometimes show (as I will point out below). Translations and textual reconstructions are reliable, except for the quotation cited as Gorgias 483e-84a, which is in fact 483b-c and 483e-484a (132-33). The book is clearly written and tightly organized throughout, and blissfully free of typos (I found only one: p. 160, n. 30).

Chapter 1 argues for the novel thesis that the hedonism Socrates introduces in Protagoras can only be understood as bodily hedonism and that there is no reconciling this thesis with Socrates' views in the Apology, Crito and Gorgias. Shaw's view thus stands against a large swath of the literature that takes Socrates to espouse hedonism himself and seeks a more highbrow account of the relevant kind of hedonism in order to accommodate this fact. He establishes, clearly and sensibly, that Socrates does not in fact endorse hedonism, but rather introduces the thesis ad hominem to test Protagoras. The chapter is well argued, thorough and complete (e.g. 18-20), sometimes even to a fault: leaving no interpretative stone unturned and engaging with the text at a substantial level of detail (e.g. 23, 25-6, 29-30). Shaw offers an important and sensible interpretation that cuts through much tangled debate over Socrates' hedonism in the Protagoras, drawing on an impressive bibliography.

Chapter 2 takes us into Socrates' first argument (349d-51b) that courage is wisdom, offering a nice account of mania as ignorance of the worst kind: the conceit of knowledge that yields the false confidence of the mad (2.2.1). It is refreshing to find Shaw addressing the connection between Socrates' first and second arguments, a topic that is too often neglected in the literature. Interestingly, he finds the argument from confidence to be successful and Protagoras' response to it a howler, which raises the question, why does Socrates continue to the second argument (351b-357e) at all? Shaw's suggestion is that Socrates goes on as he does because he is responding to Protagoras' deeper (though not validly posed) objection that a certain nature, namely spirit (thumos), is required in addition to wisdom; thus the force of Protagoras' deeper objection is that knowledge is necessary but not sufficient for courage (as opposed to sufficient but not necessary, as others have thought). Surprisingly, Shaw goes on to argue that Socrates himself takes spirit to be a necessary precondition for courage, perhaps revealing his unitarian tendencies -- here, that already the Protagoras is committed to something like the Republic's picture of a tripartite soul, or to a plurality of sources of motivation, at any rate (e.g. 66, 70). Although the case for Socrates' commitment to spirit (and thus to a non-monistic soul) is not convincing to me, the diagnosis of Protagoras as committed to the thesis that wisdom is weak and can be ruled by fear is completely compelling and correctly called out as the bridge to the second argument.

Chapter 3 turns to the dialectical context of the Protagoras, which is indeed central to understanding any argument in the dialogue. Often commentators lean too heavily on dialectical context, using the ad hominem nature of the discussion as license to find Socrates ironic, eristic or cheating in some other way; but Shaw puts the dialectical context to good use in arguing that Socrates brings the premise of hedonism to bear as a diagnosis of Protagoras without ever committing to it himself.

Shaw engages fruitfully with an ongoing debate about the elenchus, and he argues convincingly that the so-called say what you believe requirement remains in play throughout the conversation with Protagoras even when the many serve as his proxy. Shaw also clearly shows Protagoras distancing himself from three important views, which he holds but does not wish to avow: that hedonism is true, that it is prudent to be unjust, and that knowledge is weak. The introduction of the central concept of shame, however, could benefit from greater precision and depth (76, 78, 86-7, 89, 96, 99-101). For example, Shaw defines shame as fear of social hostility and then assimilates the sophists' concealment of their true views for fear of social hostility to Hippocrates' blushing at the prospect of becoming a sophist (suggested by Socrates at 312a as a possible result of becoming Protagoras' student); but these do not seem to me like the same concept of shame. My concern is that Shaw elides the boundary between dialectical context and speculative psychology: the sophists may well fear social hostility, but that need have nothing to do with the kind of shame that causes a person to blush.

In Chapter 4 Shaw introduces a distinction between procedural shame and substantive shame in the context of the Gorgias. Both are characterized as fear of what others think: procedural shame as fear of being refuted in public and substantive shame as fear of espousing a certain view in public. It seems obviously true that Protagoras (and Gorgias et al.) have both of these fears. However, if substantive shame is meant to be the kind of shame that induces blushing -- that is a case of genuine (substantive?) embarrassment -- I doubt that this describes Protagoras (or Gorgias et al.). Indeed, I doubt Shaw's central notion that the sophists have internalized the opinions of the many, which he relies on throughout the book and ultimately argues for in Chapter 5. Certainly the sophists' currency is the opinions of the many, reflecting their own views back to them (Sophist 233-35), and this creates difficulties and tensions in their stances (not least because they are reflecting the incoherent double-think that Shaw so beautifully brings out in Chapters 6-8). However, all this can be true independently of the possibility of the sophists' internalizing the views of the many, i.e. without speculating about their psychology at all. They can, as a matter of caution or prudence, fear both being refuted in public and getting caught espousing a taboo view in public, but if this is all there is to the two kinds of shame, then the thesis that Protagoras has internalized the views of the many may be otiose.

It is an interesting question, to what extent do the sophists (and pundits of today?) come to believe their own hype, so to speak. But strictly speaking, the answer to this question is independent of the fact that the sophists are navigating a tight course between their claims to expertise and the demands of democracy and popular morality -- the dialectical context that Shaw so aptly depicts. For example, Protagoras on the one hand claims to teach civic virtue and therefore must say that what he teaches is strong and cannot be dragged about by pleasure and fear. On the other hand, he has claimed (in line with popular morality) that the virtues are separate and entirely distinct. Thus he cannot (really) say that what he teaches is strong, or even teachable; nor can he admit to being in this bind without giving up on his claims to expertise and high fees. On yet another hand, he cannot avow his considered beliefs, including hedonism and the homo-mensura doctrine -- the claim that man is the measure of all things -- without setting off a collective tut-tutting of the majority's false moralizing that would scare away his customers. But all of these things can be true without Protagoras himself having internalized the views of the majority as his own, even if (or especially since) he agrees with them independently. Indeed, it is open to see Plato casting the sophists as quite sophisticated and crafty, both in their considered beliefs (which may indeed be worthy of philosophical investigation) and in their savvy navigation of popular morality. Such a view is entirely compatible with Shaw's commitment to seeing the Protagoras as a critique of sophistry; in fact it makes Plato's indictment all the more biting. The sophists are not necessarily hapless opinion-absorbers, as Shaw would have it (127-28). They can just as well be seen as giving shape to public opinion with arguments designed to reinforce what people already believe (possibly inchoately), as if feeding the moods and appetites of the huge, strong beast that they're rearing (Republic 493a-c), presumably without care for the truth (or, for the more sophisticated audience of the homo-mensura doctrine, because truth is relative).

I am also resistant to the idea running through Chapters 3 and 4 that Socrates' argument that akrasia is ignorance and courage is wisdom does not depend on hedonism; here I do find Shaw overplaying the dialectical context (99-101). It is worth noting that this particular anti-hedonist position, which denies that hedonism is relevant to the argument at all, is occupied by only one interpreter (Vlastos (1969), conspicuously absent from Shaw's discussion), while other commentators have debated not whether but how hedonism entails the denial of akrasia and the assimilation of courage to knowledge. (Nussbaum (1986) even takes Socrates to endorse hedonism pro tempore, just in order to secure the claim that virtue is an art of measurement, i.e. that virtue is a kind of knowledge or cognitive achievement). This stance on the role of hedonism is a blind spot in Shaw's otherwise excellent analysis, perhaps another symptom of his unitarian sympathies (101, 105, 113); for the non-monistic psychology of the Republic seems meant precisely to allow for akrasia and the possibility that different motivations can conflict and overpower each other (as in the Book IV case of Leontius). I would argue that hedonism is in fact central to Socrates' second argument that courage is wisdom and that it, indeed, explains why Socrates proceeds to the second argument.

Shaw puzzles over why Socrates does not go on immediately to secure the unity of virtue when Protagoras agrees that knowledge (or at least the knowledge he teaches) is strong (98). The answer, I suggest, is that in holding his knowledge to be strong Protagoras does not "effectively give up on the plurality of virtue" (98). On the contrary, what is required to secure the unity of virtue is motivational monism, which will tell a wholly different story about why knowledge is strong. The role of hedonism is to establish a picture of the soul according to which akrasia is not just false, but impossible. Otherwise, Protagoras (and Gorgias et al.) could each still claim that the knowledge he teaches is strong: this knowledge won't be ruled by fear (or pleasure) because it will win the internal battle. But that stance does not secure the denial of akrasia or, crucially, the denial of Protagoras' majority-style conception of courage as spirit overcoming fear. Thus the second argument does not argue merely for the sufficiency of knowledge for virtue (taking thumos as a necessary condition), but for a monistic picture of the soul that cannot be subject to the kind of internal conflict presupposed by Protagoras and the majority (and, indeed, Shaw). I dwell on this point to show that this aspect of his view can be carved off without violence to Shaw's valuable core insights.

Shaw's diagnosis of Gorgias' shame in Chapter 4, as shame at not being able to teach something anyone should be able to teach, is an interesting new interpretative option that paves the way for a deeply insightful diagnosis of the commitments of the many to justice as helping friends and harming enemies, to piety as begging from the gods, and to goods as inherently competitive. These views enshrine injustice as prudent and even, incoherently, essential to justice itself because they take pleasure as a competitive good and knowledge as weak. Chapter 5 argues that the sophists internalize these views of the many, which is meant to explain why the many serve as Protagoras' proxy in the discussion (and solve a handful of other puzzles that Shaw raises and tracks through the following chapters). However, it is more economical and equally explanatory to say that the many are his proxy because he agrees with them independently or, even more economical, because he reflects their views back to them and yet must distance himself from the many in order to hold himself up as an expert. The dialectical context that Shaw describes so well can provide all the materials necessary to explain why the many are Protagoras' proxy (although I would add that Protagoras steps out from behind the screen the majority provide each time, so that the refutation is not as covert as Shaw makes it to be). This is akin to the point made above, expressing doubts about substantive shame: if shame is just a matter of not getting caught, as opposed to being genuinely embarrassed so as to blush, then the psychological point about internalization is not required. As before, I make this point to signal how very much there is to agree with in Shaw's analysis and how easily this disagreement can be carved off.

Chapter 6 argues from the Republic (VII, IX) and Gorgias that hedonism is an inherently plausible thesis because pleasure is (exhaustive!) evidence of Goodness. These arguments go by a little more quickly and loosely than one might like (145, 147, 154-55, 160-61, 168), but the insight that hedonism is both plausible and yet fatally defeasible, requiring a non-hedonic measure to correct for the hedonic error of appearance, is interesting and productive (e.g. 153). Here too one might worry that Shaw's unitarian perspective is showing when he argues that the prisoners' shackles in the allegory of the cave are really bodily pleasures and that appetitive desires drive their views (154-56, 168), particularly since one might expect Shaw to put the force of public shame developed earlier to work here. However, as above, Shaw's lessons about hedonic error as the root cause of ethical error stand firm when we carve off this aspect of the view.

Chapter 7 is the highlight of the book. The conclusion, 7.4, provides a crisp and clear summary of Shaw's most valuable results. Although the details of this chapter, too, leave me with much to wonder about, I am in broad and enthusiastic agreement with Shaw's picture of pleonectic alliances that demand loyalty and justice in the cooperative pursuit of competitive goods (helping friends), at the same time demand injustice in harming enemies (the other half of this incoherent conception of justice), and yet, above all, demand the discretion to keep quiet about one's unsavory commitment to the prudence of injustice (lest one be perceived as a threat to the group). Shaw's unitarian bent does continue to show (183-34, 185-56), e.g. when he argues that (de dicto) a commitment to hedonism entails a commitment to the belief that knowledge is weak. As suggested above, hedonism is arguably what shows the very impossibility of the internal-conflict model of soul that underlies the commitment to akrasia on the part of the man. But Shaw seems to take hedonism (particularly given the specific bodily form of hedonism he identifies) as a commitment to appetite, which can conflict with reason. A corresponding account of the honor-loving soul is offered in Chapter 6, where he characterizes Protagoras as taking bodily pleasures as tokens of esteem (168). However neither view is required.

In sum, Shaw paints a masterful portrait of the majority's incoherent double-think and false moralizing, which Chapter 8 concludes by working out the conflicting alliances that make the many hostile to Socrates as well as to the sophists, i.e. an application of the theory to the complicated relationship between these three major forces in Athens. In fact, the details of this picture are so well worked out that they practically beg for application to present-day politics, particularly during an election season ripe with candidates and pleonectic alliances! Although I remain skeptical about Shaw's commitment to a passive picture of the sophists as merely internalizing public opinion (196, 204), I am delighted to have this rich and insightful portrait of the many at my disposal. Shaw has made the many come alive in ways that can be applied across the dialogues, not least because he establishes so well that the Protagoras is no outlier but, rather, "finds a coherent place in the corpus" (as he too modestly concludes).