Plato's Charmides: Positive Elenchus in a "Socratic" Dialogue

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Thomas A. Tuozzo, Plato's Charmides: Positive Elenchus in a "Socratic" Dialogue, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 359pp., $90.00 (hbk.) ISBN 9780521190404.


Reviewed by Emily A. Austin, Wake Forest University


Readers familiar with Plato's Charmides know that anyone interested in studying this uncommonly vexing dialogue would do well to seek scholarly assistance. Tom Tuozzo's recent monograph, Plato's Charmides: Positive Elenchus in a "Socratic" Dialogue, serves the purpose admirably. Tuozzo's argument comes in three stages. First, he defends his methodological approach to the Platonic corpus in light of standing debates about the characteristic features of so-called "Socratic" dialogues (3-51). Second, he offers a novel and contentious interpretation of the dialogue's characters and dramatic setting (52-131). Third, he explicates the arguments proper in order to determine what positive doctrines a careful reader might discover despite the dialogue's aporetic conclusion and its apparent threat to the legitimacy of Socratic examination (155-334). In what follows, I discuss each of these points in turn.

The Charmides keeps uneasy company with other "Socratic" dialogues, understood as those dialogues that some scholars think depict the historical Socrates pretty much as he was. It satisfies many common features of such dialogues: Socrates seeks a definitional account of a virtue (sōphrosūne) attributed to one of his interlocutors (Charmides). The assembled cast considers a series of failed definitions, Socrates repeatedly disavows any knowledge of his own about the matter, and the discussion ends in confusion. However, the closing arguments concerning self-knowledge are complex and exceptionally difficult studies in epistemology and metaphysics, and scholars of the Socratic dialogue routinely claim that Socrates lacked substantive philosophical interests outside of ethics and politics.[1] Worse yet, the final arguments of the Charmides threaten to undermine the possibility and benefit of Socratic inquiry itself, which would make it as least as much a commentary on a Socratic dialogue as an instantiation of it.

Tuozzo devotes most of his methodological energies to challenging one component of the Socratic scholarly program -- the claim that Socrates's method of examination can only uncover inconsistencies in his interlocutor's belief set. According to Gregory Vlastos, a lone encounter with the elenchus cannot tell an interlocutor which inconsistent belief to abandon, nor does it justify advancing any positive doctrine. Failing the elenchus only invites the interlocutor to reckon with his ignorance and continue his self-examination. Tuozzo, however, thinks the elenchus in the Charmides leaves the attentive reader with a clear conception of sōphrosūne and its content -- namely, knowledge of the Form of the Good.

But Vlastos et al. disempower the elenchus in part to honor Socrates's characteristic disavowals of knowledge, and Tuozzo ushers in positive doctrine at the risk of failing to take those claims seriously. This tension manifests itself most clearly in the closing pages of the book, where Tuozzo argues that the dialogue's aporia not only gestures at a solution by way of the Form of Good, but also indicates that Socrates himself knows the Form of the Good. Tuozzo radically deflates the Form of the Good in order to make it square with Socrates's epistemic humility, but readers might nevertheless worry about Tuozzo's move for two reasons. First, awarding Socrates knowledge of the Form of the Good not only runs up against his characteristic modesty, but it also imports metaphysical commitments from dialogues outside the range typically included in Socratic studies. Tuozzo rightly claims that the virtue of any methodological approach is measured by the interesting results it yields, but his willingness to cross this particular Socratic border leaves it unclear whether he thinks there is anything distinctively Socratic about the Charmides at all. Second, Tuozzo's deflation of the Form of the Good leaves it significantly disempowered. This second result seems more worrisome, so I address it in detail below.

The second stage of Tuozzo's monograph addresses the dramatic features of the dialogue. Many readers will be troubled by Tuozzo's efforts to rehabilitate the reputations of Socrates's two chief interlocutors, Critias and Charmides, both of whom played important roles in the murderous reign of the Thirty Tyrants. Xenophon casts Critias as perhaps the most ruthless leader of the Thirty (Mem. 1. 2. 12). Charmides, for his part, was among the ten who oversaw the Piraeus, where a large number of wealthy resident foreigners (metics) were killed without a trial, conveniently allowing the Tyrants to confiscate the wealth of the dead. During their short reign, the Thirty killed as many as fifteen hundred of their fellow Athenians, generally after robbing them of their rights as citizens. Nevertheless, Tuozzo concludes:

Plato undoubtedly believes that lessons were to be learned from the outcome of the political engagements of his cousins Critias and Charmides; but there is no reason to think that he traces the disastrous outcome of that engagement to moral failings in either of them (89, my emphasis).

Setting aside the fact that Charmides was Plato's uncle, not his cousin, Tuozzo here shoulders a heavy philosophical burden. To justify this assessment of Critias and Charmides, it seems that he must demonstrate that the Thirty's assumption of rule and their sustained violence resulted from forces beyond their control. Otherwise, one must wonder how Plato could reasonably absolve them of moral responsibility for the intentional killing of innocents.

Tuozzo does not fully address the historical record that exposes Critias's guilt. He encourages the reader to disregard Xenophon's testimony by leveling an ad hominemagainst him. Xenophon probably served in the cavalry under the rule of the Thirty, so Tuozzo contends that Xenophon hopes to cover up his own complicity by attacking Critias (64-5). Even if we accept this contention, however, two very important accounts of the immorality of the Thirty remain, neither of which Tuozzo addresses. In Plato's Apology, Socrates avows a clear conscience when he censures the Thirty for their vicious actions and their desire to implicate others in their guilt (Ap. 32a-b). He manages to escape complicity by refusing to help arrest Leon of Salamis. Likewise, Tuozzo quotes only one sentence from Lysias's Against Eratosthenes to illustrate that the Thirty were initially popular (62). Tuozzo overlooks the bulk of the speech, which censures Critias and his fellow tyrants for the persecution of the metics, including the murder of Lysias's brother Polemarchus and his own narrow escape with his life.[2]

However, Tuozzo does mention two passages as evidence of Critias's positive qualities, one in Plato's Timaeus (20a5-6), and the other in Aristotle's Rhetoric (1416b26-29). It remains unclear, though, whether either of these passages refers to the Critias of Plato's Charmides. Both might refer to the tyrant Critias's famously moral grandfather, also named Critias, and Aristotle does not give anything resembling a definite description of the Critias in question.

Tuozzo's rehabilitation of the dialogue's two principle interlocutors also requires that he reinterpret the dialogue's final lines. Charmides's agreement to follow Critias's order to study with Socrates, even if it requires using force against Socrates and denying him a legal hearing, seems to most readers like ominous foreshadowing. Tuozzo contends that it is merely good-natured ribbing (298-303). In sum, Tuozzo's bold attempt to reconsider Plato's relation to Critias strains the evidence.

The remainder of Tuozzo's book carefully examines the arguments in search for a definition of sōphrosūne. Here he is on his surest footing and offers the greatest interpretive assistance. Though the question of the dialogue is whether Charmides possesses and so can define sōphrosūne, Charmides quickly retreats to silence. His third attempt at a definition, "minding one's own business," is clearly borrowed from Critias, and his inability to defend the definition against Socrates's objection motivates Critias to break into the discussion in frustration. Charmides remains quiet for the remainder of the arguments proper, though Tuozzo argues (against Roochnik (1996)) that this inability to think for himself should not be held against Charmides (132-8).

Critias's efforts eventually bottom out in a definition of sōphrosūne as a special brand of self-knowledge -- a "knowledge of itself and other knowledges" -- which Tuozzo dubs the "Critian Formulation." Socrates then claims that Critias's definition entails that sōphrosūne would also give its possessor knowledge of ignorance, much as medicine, the knowledge of health, entails knowledge of sickness. According to this new "Socratic Formulation," the temperate person would know that anyone (including himself) does or does not know something and also what that person does or does not know. The crux of the debate in the secondary literature about the "Socratic Formulation" has surrounded two claims. First, it bears a strong resemblance to Socrates' own account of his divine mission in the Apology. Second, the final arguments of the Charmides show that the "Socratic Formulation" is likely impossible, and even if possible, of little to no benefit. Thus, the Socratic Mission might be full of false promise.[3]

Tuozzo addresses both the question of possibility and the question of benefit. The very complicated Powers Argument (167c-169c) terminates in a bind that calls out for a "great man" to determine whether the "Critian Formulation" of sōphrosūne is possible. This "great man" would explain whether powers (including seeing, hearing, and knowing) can ever take themselves as objects without resulting in a regress. Tuozzo offers the enticing suggestion that one might find the needed account in Aristotle's discussion of relatives in Metaphysics V 15. However, Tuozzo concedes that Aristotle is not specifically interested in cases of reflexive powers and that the passages in theMetaphysics cannot circumvent the problem of regress (226-233). In other words, had Socrates been able to consult Aristotle for a solution to his difficulties, he would likely have been disappointed.

Socrates also concludes that the "Socratic Formulation" of self-knowledge is, if possible at all, only partially possible. Though someone with self-knowledge can discernthat someone knows or does not know something, she cannot determine what that person knows or does not know. Knowing what the person knows requires a specialist who shares the relevant knowledge (e.g., of doctoring, house-building, ruling). The person who only "knows that" does not, as such, know the various sciences, so he will be unable to sort the experts from the non-experts on any given topic. As a result, the sōphrōn person's reduced powers of "knowing that" only enable her to learn things quickly and to formally examine others (172b). Many commentators argue that this formal knowledge of the nature of arguments matches Socrates' own philosophical capacities. His sort of knowledge cannot, then, save a city from disaster, since a city under his influence will allow those without knowledge to rule their fellow citizens, doctor the sick, and so on.

Tuozzo, however, argues that this "Reduced Knowledge" is not powerless or simply formal in nature, since it includes knowledge of the Form of the Good (324ff). He draws attention to the fact that the text says the possessor of Reduced Knowledge will conduct his examinations while "gazing upon knowledge" (172b5-6). If one conjoins the commonly shared claim that Socrates possesses Reduced Knowledge with Tuozzo's claim that "gazing upon knowledge" involves knowledge of the Good, then one might be tempted to allow Tuozzo his conclusion that Socrates knows the Good. However, the persistent specter of Socrates's disavowal of knowledge necessarily reasserts itself. How, one might wonder, can Socrates possibly know the Form of the Good if he consistently disavows knowledge of anything of significance? Tuozzo recognizes this difficulty, and he argues that the solution lies in reconceiving knowledge of the Good as elenchic in nature (324n32).

This resourceful maneuver, however, deflates the content of the Form of the Good to such an extent that it might create a significantly larger problem than it solves. Recall that Reduced Knowledge does not enable its possessor to save the city from the merciless rule of idiots. That is why Socrates concludes that even if such knowledge were possible, it would be of little to no benefit. It cannot sort those who know from those who do not know, so it cannot even identify the true ruler or doctor. Thus, Tuozzo's deflationary conception of the Form of the Good is in tension with the Republic's assertion that the philosopher-ruler's grasp of the Form of the Good preserves the city, in part by ensuring that citizens pursue only those activities for which they are well-suited. One might reasonably think that the lesson of the Charmides is that Socrates cannot save the city from the likes of Critias because he only has Reduced Knowledge.

By far the greatest virtue of Tuozzo's book is his insistence on taking the debate into entirely new terrain. Readers who seek a fresh perspective on the Charmides will greatly benefit from grappling with his immensely novel and clever arguments.


Benson, H. H. (2000) Socratic Wisdom. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hyland, D. A. (1981) The Virtue of Philosophy: An Interpretation of Plato's Charmides. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press.

Kahn, C. H. (1996) Plato and the Socratic Dialogue. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

McKim, R. (1985) "Socratic Self-knowledge and 'Knowledge of Knowledge' in Plato's Charmides." Transactions of the American Philological Association 115: 59-77.

Roochnik, D. L. (1996) Of Art and Wisdom: Plato's Understanding of Techne. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.

Schmid, W. T. (1998) Plato's Charmides and the Socratic Ideal of Rationality. Albany: State University of New York Press.

[1] Hugh Benson (2000), however, systematically defends the view that Socrates was in fact very interested in epistemology.

[2] Polemarchus is Socrates' second interlocutor in Book One of Plato's Republic, and Socrates mentions his conversion to philosophy at Phaedrus 257b.

[3] See especially Kahn (1996: 197-209).