Plato's Dialectic at Play: Argument, Structure, and Myth in Plato's Symposium

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Kevin Corrigan and Elena Glazov-Corrigan, Plato's Dialectic at Play: Argument, Structure, and Myth in Plato's Symposium, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2004, 266pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271024623.

Reviewed by David Konstan, Brown University


In the heyday of analytic philosophy, studies of Plato tended to concentrate above all on those passages in the dialogues that resembled, or might be made to resemble, rigorous arguments. Scholars supplied missing premises, added the necessary intermediate steps, and evaluated the validity of the inferences. Here and there Plato received good marks, or was applauded for a good try. More often, he failed to live up to modern standards of argumentation. Worst of all, great stretches of his dialogues were left out of the discussion, and the dialogue form itself was treated as little more than a tic.

Today, scholars are more often disposed to recognize that Plato's dialogues have their own coherence, and must be addressed in their own terms. Nowhere does this imperative seem clearer than in the case of his Symposium, where Socrates shares the scene with five other speakers who precede him, delivers his own discourse in the form of a dialogue with a priestess in which he is distinctly the apprentice and she the master, and finally is obliged, along with the other symposiasts, to yield the floor to a new and boisterous arrival, who proceeds to launch on a mock eulogy and censure of Socrates himself. How, in all of this, can one extract Plato's own beliefs about love -- the ostensible theme of the dialogue -- and whatever other matters are touched on in passing?

Kevin Corrigan and Elena Glazov-Corrigan have teamed up to produce an original, elegantly written, and daring interpretation of the dialogue as a whole. I was not always persuaded by their readings of one or another passage, nor am I in full sympathy with their approach, but I found the book stimulating and enjoyable to read.

C&G-C affirm that in Plato, "the dialogical form was not merely ornamentation but an integral part of both philosophical and artistic exploration" (2). The mention of art here is vital, since C&G-C believe that the Symposium sheds essential light on Plato's aesthetic theory, and that the view he implicitly advances here is a necessary complement to his critique of imitation in the Republic. What is more, C&G-C argue that "the speakers in the Symposium are not merely inferior cartoon-figures" used to set off Socrates', or Diotima's, superior wisdom, but that there is rather "a connection between the persona of each individual speaker and his (and in the case of Diotima, her) speech or view of the nature of love." (2). There might, of course, be such a connection -- each interlocutor being characterized in a manner that somehow conforms to the view of love expressed -- without its contributing importantly to the position adopted by Socrates at the end, but C&G-C seek to show that there is in fact a ladder or progression implicit in the arrangement of speeches that is essential to the ultimate meaning of the dialogue.

Why, then, have students of Plato missed this aspect of the work, and failed to recognize that the Symposium amounts to a companion-piece to his statements about art in the Republic? It is because Plato is "not merely a major philosophical thinker, but also a playful multidimensional writer" (3), who makes Diotima's discussion of the higher mysteries of er™s "a multidimensional energy focus for the pulsating design that informs so many of the narrative structures of the work" (5). Read this way, one may encounter "Plato's positive theory of art … , a theory impossible to uncover if the narrative is viewed as a static structure or a preestablished hierarchy" (5).

Philosophers, do not turn away at once! Despite the florid language here and elsewhere, C&G-C in general write clearly and set out their case carefully. True to its method, almost half the book is devoted to the prologue and the speeches that precede Socrates' conversation with Diotima, and another substantial portion treats Alcibiades' arrival at the end (there is also a general conclusion, which introduces a new topic on the genre of the Symposium); not much more than a fifth, in fact, is dedicated specifically to Socrates' (or Diotima's) arguments, and here the emphasis is on the connection with the rest of the dialogue.

The opening chapter draws a contrast between Apollodorus and Aristodemus, Socrates' loyal disciples through whom the events at the symposium are narrated, and Socrates himself. They are concerned to preserve the memory of the great event, whereas Socrates, according to C&G-C, would have told the story differently (14). The third-hand narration of the symposium resembles the Republic's "imitation of an imitation" in being "thrice removed from truth" (20). When C&G-C propose, however, that Apollodorus is described as "soft" (the text is problematic here) because he is a "receptive narrator," I sense some overreading, and still more in their suggestion, tentative though it is, that the contrast between the frustrated Apollodorus and the contented Aristodemus in the prologue foreshadows "lack and plenty in the character of Diotima's eros" (16).

C&G-C are aware of the danger of overinterpretation. "How far," they ask, "should we press details in the prologues and early speeches?" (23); or again: "where are we to set the limits that separate the futile from the fertile?" (26). Not every reader will draw the line where C&G-C do. For example, Eryximachus, in proposing that the assembled group pronounce eulogies of Love, disclaims responsibility for the topic, saying: "The beginning of my argument accords with Euripides' Melanippe: for 'mine is not the story' I am about to tell, but rather it is that of Phaedrus here" (177A). A little later Eryximachus says that Phaedrus should lead off the speeches, since he is in the first position at the table and is the "father of the argument" (177D). C&G-C suggest that the reference to Melanippe "puts a woman at the origin of the dialogue, a woman who is immediately displaced" (40); moreover, "it cannot be entirely accidental that Melanippe is a mythical paradigm of a wise woman who mediates between the divine and the human" (40-41), and so may be a figure for Diotima (in a footnote, C&G-C note that the mythical Melanippe was impregnated by Poseidon and suffered a tragic fate).

Whether there is significance to the order of the speeches has been a matter of considerable debate, and even those who agree that Plato has carefully arranged them give radically different accounts of how and why. C&G-C offer their own view: "we shall argue not only that each speech reflects the character and situation of each individual speaker as well as a certain type or genre, but also that there is a distinct ordering pattern that only gradually emerges and that has much to do with the criticism of mimetic art in the Republic" (49). What is more, "when character type and speech are juxtaposed and set against the image of the lover's ascent that transfixes the dialogue as a whole, what emerges is … a dialectic of strikingly complex structure, which simultaneously presents a series of problematic images and a comic-tragic document of the epoch preceding the trial and death of Socrates" (50).

Phaedrus comes first, and C&G-C make much his example of Alcestis' self-sacrifice in behalf of her husband, which is then overridden by that of Achilles' love for Patroclus, who, according to Phaedrus, was Achilles' lover: "Just as the name Melanippe was voiced only to be immediately displaced, so Phaedrus makes of Alcestis an ideal to be displaced again by the male ideal, Achilles" (53). But there is more: "if the beloved can die on behalf of the lover, removed from the inspiration of love, then the love of which Phaedrus speaks is not the ultimate source of excellence" (53-54). Plato is thus opening the way to a richer conception of love, to those who take note of this paradox within Phaedrus' speech; in addition, Phaedrus' praise of the beloved's devotion is consistent with his own role within the dialogue as the beloved of Eryximachus. Pausanias' speech, which follows, "is surely one of the most powerful and yet most chilling examples of deconstructive drama every presented," a sophistic piece of rhetoric that is riddled with "mutually inconsistent theses and false statements" (60). Once again, Pausanias' speech is self-serving, since he is the sophist teacher who preaches submission on the part of the beloved to his teacher/lover. Eryximachus, the doctor, comes next, and again, "his personal preoccupations naturally dictate his philosophical conclusions: he does not like debauchery, and the baser kind of love becomes for him a principle of disorder." (67) No one denies that Aristophanes' speech is a brilliant tour-de-force (though his name does not mean "best-speaker," as C&G-C assert [71], but rather "he who appears best"); but it too is based on a contradiction, as C&G-C point out: love represents a desire to return to the original state of wholeness, before we were split in half to become the two-legged creatures we now are, but "the original globular creatures were violent, impious, and unintelligent" (74); our passion not only has no transcendent goal, but aspires, paradoxically, to a state inferior to our own. This is tantamount, according to C&G-C, to submitting to the charms of mimetic poetry rather than resisting them, as Plato advises in the Republic: and what is more natural than that a comic poet should adopt such a stance? Finally, Agathon's character too determines the nature of his contribution, which expresses not so much his role as tragic poet but "his sophistic naivete, and his privileged, cultivated upbringing" (90): "Once again there is a striking similarity between the characteristics of the speaker and his depiction of Eros," for Agathon "puts into Love's character everything that is considered 'good' by the tradition to which he belongs and of which he has had the personal fortune to be a darling" (92). C&G-C quote Republic 492A to give an idea of "some of the pessimism and world-weary sadness that Plato must have felt in the presence of such young men as Agathon" (96).

What, then, of Socrates' speech, or rather, his rehearsal of his conversation with Diotima? "Socrates' speech is meant to be questioned, not least because the apparently airy-fairy business of 'the beautiful itself' in the mouth of a barely fictional 'Diotima' virtually compels us to question its authenticity" (108). But the projection of Socrates' views on to another has side benefits. Among other things, "All five previous speeches are caught in different cages of subjectivity. By adopting the dialectical method and giving his speech to Diotima, Socrates gives a new objectivity to his position" (114). As C&G-C state later, "the Socrates-Diotima dialectic is not a procrustean reduction of heterodoxy into monochromatic hierarchical Platonic orthodoxy, but the free play of the reflection of others' voices, of ideas, in dialectical transformation" (193). Diotima is also holy, as a priestess, and, as a woman, has a claim to being the "mother of the tale" (116). But the myth that Diotima relates about the parentage of Love "can only be appreciated if the images of the myth are called into question" (128); myths are subject to criticism just because they are meant to be taken seriously. This is why "some Neoplatonist attempts to think these myths as myths for themselves may well be preferable to some modern scholarship which holds to the rather pedestrian and too restrictive principle that only 'arguments' make the hard core of real philosophy" (129).

Diotima's idea of procreation in the beautiful "does not present a consistent or even any possible physical image, but rather thematizes the image of sexual desire and arousal in vivid physical language that does not describe any actual physical encounter" (139). I shall not rehearse how Diotima implicitly criticizes the positions of all the earlier speakers, save to report C&G-C's conclusion that "Socrates' speech, then, overthrows, comments on, and reshapes every major point in the earlier self-possessed speeches" (159). Just because "Platonic love" must be inferred from "the whole of the Symposium up to this point, such love is plainly not impersonal or abstract … for it is directly personal and intersubjective and has practical, testable consequences" (160). Plotinus' mystical intepretation "is still superior to many modern accounts" just because "he evidently holds the view that 'Platonic love' is not to be restricted to Socrates' speech alone" (162).

How does one "test" the truths that are narrated? By their consequences for the characters in the dialogue. For example, we can "test the 'truth' of the mystical ascent to the beautiful of Diotima's speech in the transformation effected by this search in Socrates himself" (174), which is revealed by Alcibiades bursting upon the scene in the finale of the dialogue. "Alcibiades' speech, so comic, so humorous, is in fact also the tragic climax of the Symposium" (179). C&G-C do not remark upon the odd reversal whereby the young Alcibiades, who should be positioned as the beloved, assumes the role of lover, while Socrates is cast as the reluctant object of pursuit. This inversion of the traditional roles assumed by Phaedrus and Pausanias (and subtly challenged by Eyrximachus and Alcibiades, who present an exceptional version of reciprocal erotic passion) surely has meaning for Plato's conception of eros. I would also quarrel with the view that Plato's idea of the good "necessarily involves care for others"; the fact that "the would-be philosopher-king must even on occasion be compelled to go back into the cave" (182) is a sign that contemplation of the good is a self-sufficient activity that cannot readily be reconciled with service to one's fellow human beings.

The conclusion announces that the Symposium is cast "in a form entirely new to the development of human thought" (188); more precisely, "the Symposium is a drama of many different genres, each free and playful in its own way, and yet all of them brought together into what is essentially a new artistic and philosophical form" (189). Again, "for the first time in the history of human thought, a new genre emerges" (196) -- which genre? C&G-C categorically affirm: "the Symposium is demonstrably the first novel in human history" (200), understanding by "novel" the polyphonic literary form defined by Mikhail Bakhtin. Along with this, the Symposium "matches exactly, but in dramatic form, the movement of dialectic in Republic 6-7" (204). I have not the space to describe just how this works, but C&G-C declare that "the real conclusion of our work is that the two dialogues were essentially conceived and articulated together" (215). What is more, the Symposium is an "enactment of Plato's most positive view of art" (217), and hence the crucial corrective to his negative critique in the Republic.

There is much that is richly suggestive in this book, and equally much that is, to my mind, frustratingly hazy. Plato must have intended a work like the Symposium to be something other than a mere exercise in logical deduction, and it surely invites the reader to reflect on the mystery of desire in the broadest sense -- the aspiration to something higher that reveals a fundamental lack in the human self. Taking into account the different views expressed and how they relate to one another is the right way to approach the dialogue, and C&G-C are engaging tour guides, pointing out intriguing details, raising questions, and offering arresting interpretations. Whether so grand a synthesis as that offered by C&G-C is plausible is another question. I have taken care in this review to cite enough of the authors' own words to permit readers to form a preliminary judgment of their own