Plato's Erotic World: From Cosmic Origins to Human Death

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Jill Gordon, Plato's Erotic World: From Cosmic Origins to Human Death, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 254pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107024113.

Reviewed by Josh Wilburn, University of Victoria


Jill Gordon examines the role of eros in the fictive world of Plato's dialogues. By exploring dialogues not typically recognized as 'erotic', she aims to show that Plato consistently presents eros as a central and inextricable feature of human existence from beginning to end, one which, if properly directed, provides the foundation of a well-lived life. The book has many merits, but also some notable shortcomings, both of which are discussed below.

Gordon begins with her analysis of the Timaeus, which provides the basis for the rest of the book's arguments. Eros, she contends, is present in the demiurge's original mixing of the human soul. It is not, therefore, an incidental feature of embodied existence, but rather an essential, divine component of the human soul from its very creation. If we guide our erotic desire correctly during our embodied lives, then we will live well and, in our afterlife, achieve the return to our 'noetic origins' that we all seek.

In Chapters 2 through 5 Gordon treats the role of eros in human life and identifies the kinds of practices, attitudes, and relationships required to make proper, philosophical use of it. She examines (Chapter 2) the etymological connections drawn in the Cratylus between the Greek words for 'hero', 'eros', and 'to question'. Gordon suggests that, for Plato, questioning and eros are closely tied: both involve a perceived lack -- the object of longing in the case of eros and the answer in the case of a question -- as well as a desire to fill the lack. On her account, the erotic expert -- which Socrates himself claims to be at Symposium 177d -- turns out to be the skilled philosophical questioner whose questioning is key to realizing our ultimate erotic aspirations. Erotic/philosophical questioning, however, is a precarious business, in that it necessarily involves exposing one's ignorance and challenging established opinions. For that reason it requires courage, a theme that Chapter 3 explores further through a treatment of Parmenides.

In Chapters 4 and 5 Gordon examines the importance of erotic relationships. Chapter 4 looks to the Theaetetus. She makes the case that Socrates' professed skill of 'matchmaking' is best understood as the skill of directing the beloved's attention both toward the lover best-suited for advancing the former's erotic/philosophical progress, and ultimately, toward the ultimate objects of the beloved's erotic desire, the objects of knowledge themselves. Chapter 5 turns to one of the traditional 'erotic' dialogues, Alcibiades I, and attempts to illuminate that dialogue's depiction of erotic guidance as the key to self-knowledge.

Finally, in Chapter 6, Gordon examines the significance of human death in Plato's erotic world, as it is depicted in the Phaedo. She argues that -- contrary to some interpretations of the text -- the Phaedo does not denigrate the role of the senses in our pursuit of knowledge. Rather, the text depicts philosophy as the erotic activity characteristic of human souls that are 'imprisoned' in a sensible world, and that therefore need the senses to 'remind' them of their 'noetic origins'. Eros, Gordon concludes, is thus an inescapable and ubiquitous feature of human experience, one which mediates between our alienation from our divine origins and our longing to return to them: 'We enter the world with eros, we cultivate it, and we follow it to our fates' (225).

The book's strengths lie in Gordon's exploration of themes, her attention to dramatic nuances, and her penetrating insights into the dialogues' literary features, characters, and inter-connections. These strengths are especially on display in the middle chapters. Gordon's use of the Cratylus' etymology discussed above, for example, is astute and illuminating: she applies her reading of the etymological connections between 'eros' and 'questioning' to the Symposium's treatment of eros, and the effect is a fresh and helpful interpretation of some of that text's key passages. Gordon is also persuasive in her efforts to expose the erotic tensions of the Parmenides, partly through an attentive reading of Parmenides' (often neglected) reference to Ibycus' poem at 136e-137b. Throughout the book, moreover, Gordon provides much useful comment on various ways in which Plato associates philosophy -- through metaphor or otherwise -- with masculine, homoerotic practices and culture, such as wrestling, fighting, horsemanship, and the virtue of courage. Finally, she presents a strong case (contra Schleiermacher) for the coherence, philosophical acuity, and Platonic authenticity of Alcibiades I. Her positive contributions to our understanding of these and other Platonic themes and connections are both original and significant.

Despite its merits, however, the book often fails to provide the level of philosophical clarity, detail, and rigor that one would like. Gordon's treatment of the Timaeus offers an instructive example in this regard. To begin with, her reading of 42a-b -- the passage she identifies as the starting-point for her book's overarching argument -- is extremely difficult to square with the text. The relevant background is that, according to Timaeus' account of human creation, the Demiurge constructed the divine, 'immortal' element of human souls himself, leaving the construction of the 'mortal' element of human souls to the Lesser Gods. At 42a-b, the Demiurge predicts to the human souls he has created what will happen to them upon their embodiment. The passage reads:

Now when, by necessity, [the souls] should be implanted in bodies and made subject to whatever might come into and go out of their body, here's what would necessarily happen. First, there would be sensation, one and the same for all of them and innate, arising from forceful affections; and second, erotic love, mixed with pleasure and pain; and in addition to these, terror and anger and whatever goes along with them. (Kalkavage's translation, modified by Gordon).

Later, while describing the Lesser Gods' construction of the 'mortal' soul, and in a passage that strikingly parallels 42a-b, Timaeus says that the mortal soul contains 'terrible but necessary affections' including pleasure, pain, fear, and anger, all of which are mixed with 'irrational sensation and all-venturing eros' (69c-d).

The traditional line of interpretation understands 69c-d as a recapitulation of 42a-b. If that reading is correct, then evidently both passages identify eros as a constituent of the irrational, mortal soul -- a 'terrible but necessary' affection. In particular, Gordon claims, the traditional interpretation takes Timaeus to be invoking the Republic's tripartite account of the soul at 42a-b and understands the eros mentioned there to belong the soul's worst, appetitive part. Against this view, Gordon wants to argue (i) that Timaeus does not invoke tripartition in the text; (ii) that the eros at 42a-b is attributed to the divine, immortal soul, as part of its original mixture as crafted by the Demiurge; (iii) that this eros is therefore a positive 'blessing' granted to us by the god -- it is, she writes, 'part of the divine soul, our original and best condition, unpolluted and disembodied' (21); and finally, (iv) that Plato draws a sharp contrast in the text between eros, which is divine and plays a vital role in our return to our 'noetic origins', and appetite, epithumia, which is a 'mortal' disturbance that stands in the way of that return.

All of this serves Gordon's ultimate goal, which is to show that eros is an essential feature of the human soul from its very genesis, and one that ultimately guides us back to our 'noetic origins'. However, there are numerous confusions and problems involved in claims (i)-(iv), and in her arguments for them. Take claim (i). Gordon makes the curious assertion that the argument for reading tripartition in Timaeus depends on 42a-b -- and in particular, on identifying anger and fear in that passage with the spirited part of the soul, and eros with the appetitive part of the soul (25). This is straightforwardly false, however. Clearly the strongest textual reasons for taking Timaeus to invoke tripartition lie in his detailed account of the mortal soul at 69d ff., where he distinguishes a 'better' and a 'worse' part of the mortal soul in terms that resound with Socrates' characterizations of the spirited and appetitive parts in the Republic. Gordon does not discuss the significance of that passage at all in this context, however, and treats her arguments against identifying eros with the appetites at 42a-b as decisive against reading tripartition in the text.

Claims (ii) and (iii) are closely related. Gordon's argument here begins harmlessly enough. She rightly draws attention to some important differences between 42a-b and 69c-d that should give interpreters pause about assuming that the later passage is a mere recapitulation of the former. Moreover, her claim that the eros mentioned at 42a-b is experienced by the immortal, not the mortal, soul may by itself be a tenable claim. This reading has, in fact, already been entertained by Rachana Kamtekar (2010) and defended by Filip Karfík (2005), though Gordon does not discuss or cite their works. Indeed, one of the regrettable features of her discussion is that she entirely ignores much of the recent, good work on precisely the issues in the Timaeus that she is dealing with. Especially egregious is her neglect of the excellent work of Thomas Johansen, who has explored the differences between 42a-b and 69c-d in detail in his monograph (2004).

Even if we grant that it is the immortal soul that experiences eros at 42a-b, however, Gordon's ultimate conclusion -- that the eros in question is part of the original, best condition of the disembodied immortal soul -- is difficult to reconcile with the text. First, Timaeus makes it clear that eros and the other affections he mentions arise only when the souls are implanted in bodies 'and made subject to whatever might come into and go out of their body'. It is due to the nature of the body itself and the motions and external disturbances to which it is subject that eros arises at 42a-b. Furthermore, Timaeus characterizes eros and the other affections in distinctively negative terms: he twice emphasizes that they arise 'by necessity' (42a5, a6), and he calls them a 'turbulent and irrational mob' that must be mastered in order to return to our 'original and best condition' (42c-d). Indeed, the purpose of the Demiurge's comments is to explain to the souls that they are responsible for any evil that they might perpetrate during their lives. The whole discussion at 42a-b, therefore, is a description of the disruptive forces that result from embodiment and can lead us toward evil. Eros is one of those forces: it is not part of our best condition in this passage, but rather one of the primary threats to that condition.

One problem with Gordon's claim (iv) is that she fails to offer a clear and consistent account of 'eros'. She sometimes speaks of it as a 'capacity' and other times as a 'desire', and in the latter case she is not clear about what precisely eros is a desire for. Mostly commonly she speaks of a yearning for our 'noetic origins', but we never learn exactly what that phrase means. On the one hand, she sometimes speaks as if what eros seeks is a cognitive condition -- namely, the possession of knowledge. On the other hand, she also associates eros with the soul's 'alienation' from, or 'individuation' out of, the Demiurge's original soul mixture, and accordingly she sometimes characterizes eros as 'a desire for being and wholeness' or 'a desire for reunification' (6). This characterization makes it sound as if what eros seeks is not a cognitive condition, but rather a quasi-material return to the original mixture. She never provides any clue as to how these two senses might be related.

In any event, Gordon's insistence on a sharp distinction between a divine, beneficial eros and a mortal, harmful epithumia seems unsupported by the text. Much of her argument rests on the one clearly positive mention of eros in the dialogue: at 46d-e Timaeus refers to the 'lover (erastês) of understanding and knowledge' who pursues first causes. Indeed, this passage provides strong support for Gordon's claim that some form of eros can play a positive role in our cognitive progress. However, there are also clearly negative references to eros in the text. Referring to Timaeus' discussion of the mortal soul, Gordon claims, 'In none of these passages from 70a to 90c is eros named as part of the mortal soul housed in the various parts of the body' (44). What she systematically ignores, however, is the crucial reference to eros immediately before 70a, where Timaeus states that all the affections belonging to the mortal soul are 'mixed' with 'all-venturing eros'. There is no need for Timaeus to refer to eros throughout his discussion of the mortal soul's disturbing affections, because he has already stipulated that every one of them involves eros. Conversely, despite Gordon's claim that 'epithumia has no role in the divine or any connection to our noetic origins' (48), Timaeus clearly states at 88b that 'there are two kinds of appetites (epithumiai) in human nature -- appetites of the body for food and appetites of the most divine part of us for wisdom' (cf. Republic 586d).

Gordon's insistence on the divine and positive role of eros and on the contrast between eros and epithumia leads her to spend much of her time arguing for dubious and ill-conceived conclusions, while neglecting more moderate and plausible claims that could serve her most important goals just as well. What the texts support, and what Gordon does a good job of exploring throughout the book, is the idea that the human soul, by its very nature, contains a desire or longing for knowledge that it lacks, and that that desire is an essential feature of embodied human experience. Gordon's insistence that we call that desire 'eros' is unnecessary; certainly Plato did not share it. Similarly, her insistence that eros must always be contrasted with disruptive, bodily affections seems willful in the face of what the texts actually say (strangely, she never discusses Socrates' distinction between 'divine' and 'human' eros at Phaedrus 266a-b).

The problems that characterize Gordon's reading of the Timaeus -- unnecessary overgeneralization, forced readings of the text, and neglect of relevant passages and secondary sources -- recur throughout the book. Those looking for an enlightening reading of many of the dialogues' literary and dramatic features definitely should consult Gordon's book, for she has much of value to say about erotic themes in Plato. Those looking for clear and tightly argued analysis of Plato's philosophy should look elsewhere.


Johansen, Thomas. 2004. Plato's Natural Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kalkavage, Peter. 2001. Plato's Timaeus. Newburyport, Massachusetts: Focus Publishing.

Kamtekar, Rachana. 2010. 'Psychology and Inculcation of Virtue in Plato's Laws', in Plato's Laws: A Critical Guide, Christopher Bobonich (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 127-148.

Karfík, Filip. 2005. 'What the Mortal Parts of the Soul Really Are', Rhizai 2, 197-217.