Plato's Forms in Transition: A Reading of the Parmenides

Placeholder book cover

Samuel C. Rickless, Plato's Forms in Transition: A Reading of the Parmenides, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 272 pp., $96.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521864565.

Reviewed by John Palmer, University of Florida


The Parmenides remains perhaps the most puzzling Platonic dialogue. It opens with Socrates responding to a Zenonian argument by positing separate forms of similarity, plurality, unity, rest, change, and so on, and by claiming that particulars have their attributes in virtue of their participation in these entities. But Parmenides shows Socrates that his hypothesis is susceptible to various difficulties, given his as yet inadequate training, and then demonstrates the method he is to employ whenever positing a form's existence. Parmenides' demonstration focuses on the One, or the form of unity, and produces a mind-boggling array of rapid and complex deductions making up more than two-thirds of the dialogue. There have been deep divisions ever since antiquity over the ultimate point of this dialectical exercise, and its bearing upon the issues raised in the dialogue's first part remains an outstanding problem. Samuel Rickless's ambitious study undertakes to do nothing less than furnish a complete logical reconstruction of all the dialogue's arguments and therein to find "the key needed to solve the enduring mystery of the Parmenides" (ix). The answer to the dialogue's major questions, he optimistically assures us in his Introduction, "is, at bottom, remarkably simple" (5).

Rickless's first chapter draws upon earlier dialogues to present what he dubs "the high theory of forms." This is a comprehensive theory comprising two basic axioms and numerous theorems deduced from them in conjunction with certain auxiliary assumptions about opposites, causation, sensibles, and knowledge (all neatly summarized at pages 44-5 and abbreviated in a list and flow-chart at the end of the preface). Its two axioms are: the One-over-Many axiom, that for any property F and any plurality of F things, there is a form of F-ness by virtue of partaking of which each member of the plurality is F, and the Itself-by-Itself axiom, that every form is itself by itself (auto kath' auto [sic]), such that "every form is numerically distinct from, and not present in, the things that partake of it" (5). The resulting theory is meant to embody all the most important claims of Plato's middle-period metaphysics and epistemology. The Parmenides' Socrates turns this theory into "the higher theory of forms" by adding the axiom of Radical Purity, according to which no form can have contrary properties. Chapter 2 considers how Parmenides' criticisms suggest this theory needs to be modified. Chapter 3 articulates a view of the method Parmenides recommends that enables one to read it "as a direct and rational response to the problems raised in the first part of the dialogue" (95). Chapters 4 through 7 then run through the arguments in Parmenides' demonstration of this method to reveal what Rickless takes to be the Parmenides' fundamental lesson, namely, that certain principles of the high and higher theories of forms are to be abandoned. These prove to be the high theory's theorem of Uniqueness -- for any property F, there is exactly one form of F-ness; its theorem of Purity -- for any property F that admits a contrary (con-F), the F is not con-F; the higher theory's axiom of Radical Purity; and the auxiliary assumption of No Causation by Contraries -- for any property F that admits a contrary (con-F), whatever makes something be (or become) F cannot itself be con-F -- from which the theorem of Purity is in part derived.

It will not be necessary further to summarize Rickless's understanding of Parmenides' criticisms of Socrates' theory and of the response to them indicated in the dialectical exercise, for he has himself done so at length in his article on the Parmenides for the web-based Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy ( Instead, since how one understands what Plato has to say about forms in previous dialogues will obviously determine to a large degree how one is inclined to respond to Parmenides' criticisms of young Socrates' theory, it will be worth concentrating first on some of the presuppositions that guide Rickless's reconstruction of the "high" and "higher theory of forms" before turning to some of the problems in his account of how the Parmenides indicates this theory needs to be revised.

The systematizing impulse driving Rickless's reconstruction of the theory of Forms is reminiscent of that found in Russell Dancy's Plato's Introduction of Forms (Cambridge, 2004), which set out to explain the theory of forms in the Phaedo and Symposium as an outgrowth of the Socratic quest for definitions. This is not surprising since Rickless's preface describes how he began seriously studying Plato while Dancy's junior colleague at Florida State University and acknowledges the impact Dancy's 1997 graduate seminar on the Parmenides had on his own intellectual development. Out of it came his first publication in ancient philosophy, "How Parmenides saved the theory of forms" (The Philosophical Review 107 [1998], 501-54), which this monograph now supercedes. Rickless perhaps does not altogether appreciate the depth of Dancy's influence on his approach to the problems he tackles here. The very impulse to systematize is an important case in point.

Rickless never doubts that the middle-period dialogues contain a fully-developed theory of forms. In actual fact, however, the existence of certain imperceptible forms in which sensible particulars participate is typically presented as no more than Socrates' favored hypothesis. This status is especially clear in the Phaedo, where it enters the third argument that the philosopher should welcome death as something Socrates and his interlocutors already agree upon (65d4-7), and where it is likewise presumed without further argument in both the recollection and affinity arguments for the soul's immortality. Socrates' recap of the recollection argument marks the existence of forms as an unargued and as yet unsecured hypothesis (76d7-e7), and he makes it perfectly clear in his subsequent account of his method that the forms' existence has merely the status of a hypothesis (100a3-b9). Rather than a fully developed theory of forms, the Phaedo gives us a theory under construction, and much the same holds true of the Symposium and Republic. A crucial feature of the method of hypothesis as described in the Meno, Phaedo, and Republic is that it eventually becomes necessary to go beyond just considering what accords with one's hypothesis by examining the hypothesis itself, with a view to ultimately grounding it in an unhypothesized first principle. The Parmenides is best understood as conducting the projected examination of Socrates' favored hypothesis.

Since the "theory of forms" is more accurately a hypothesis under development in the Symposium, Phaedo, and Republic, Rickless's attempt to furnish a systematic reconstruction of the "theory" in would-be definitive fashion not only is misplaced but also makes it more difficult than necessary to understand what to make of Parmenides' criticisms. These criticisms promote an adequate formulation of the hypothesis by pointing out the disastrous consequences of, most notably, conceiving of the participation relation in too crudely physical a manner and conceiving of the forms themselves as perfect instances or exemplars of the properties to which they correspond. Certainly there are places in the middle-period dialogues where the hypothesis is presented in ways that suggest the latter crude conception, notably in the Phaedo's description of the form of equality as "the equals themselves" (auta ta isa, 74c1), a problematic plural recurring in the Parmenides when Socrates refers to the form of similarity as "the similars themselves" (auta ta homoia, 129b1). There is no need to embrace the plural's implication that the form of equality is a pair of equal things, however, for the more adequate formulation of the hypothesis later in the dialogue, when Socrates describes how he came to rely on it in his inquiries, suggests that this early statement of the dialogue's governing hypothesis is intentionally problematic.

In the later passage, Socrates describes how he can no longer accept, as explanations of what makes things beautiful, references to their having a bright color or a certain shape (100c9-d2), saying that he prefers instead the safe explanation that "if anything else is beautiful besides the beautiful itself (auto to kalon), it is beautiful for no other reason than that it participates (metechei) in that beautiful" (100c4-6; cf. 100d3-e3). The point of rejecting bright color or a certain shape as what makes things beautiful is that, while these properties may well be sufficient to make some things beautiful sometimes, neither is in fact necessary, whereas the form of beauty is supposed to be that property instantiation of which is both a necessary and sufficient condition of a thing's being beautiful. Already in the Phaedo, then, Plato suggests a conception of forms as properties, and of participation as property instantiation, that is much less problematic than the conception of forms as individual and perfect instances of a property that drives some of the Parmenides criticisms. The important passage just quoted, moreover, already suggests that there is a fundamental difference between the way the form of beauty is beautiful and the way other things are beautiful.

Rickless's presumption that it possible to reconstruct a canonical middle-period theory of forms in part explains his inattentiveness to the indications in dialogues prior to the Parmenides that Plato already envisaged a way to conceive of the forms that would not founder upon Parmenides' criticisms. For the attempt to provide a single, over-arching statement of the "theory of forms" that will account for all previous references to these entities results in a certain dumbing down of the view. This is apparent, for example, in Rickless's understanding of the problem of the compresence of opposites, encapsulated in his Impurity of Sensibles principle, that "for any property F that admits a contrary (con-F), all sensible F things are con-F" (23). He claims to find direct evidence for this principle in Republic 5's description of "the many beautiful things," on which the sight-lovers focus their attention, as also appearing ugly (479a-b), for Rickless takes these many beautiful things to be particular objects. He fails to notice, however, that when the sight-lovers are introduced as accepting "beautiful things" (kala pragmata) but not beauty itself (476c1-3), these are the "beautiful sounds, colors, shapes, and all the things fashioned from these" the sight-lovers have just been said to enjoy (476b4-6). It is surely no accident that the same properties the Phaedo's Socrates can no longer accept as making things beautiful recur so prominently here. The connection is just one thing that tells in favor of the more philosophically sophisticated interpretation of the problem of the compresence of opposites developed by Terence Irwin (in "The theory of Forms," in G. Fine, ed. Plato I: Metaphysics and Epistemology [Oxford, 1999], 143-70; and Irwin, Plato's Ethics [Oxford, 1995], chap. 10, a study which Rickless cites but does not properly engage with). Rickless's flat-footed understanding of the problem of the compresence of opposites drives him to embrace a conception of forms as free from this impurity: "the many sensible F things have a property that the F itself does not possess, namely the property of being con-F" (37). This is, of course, the fundamental theorem of Purity in Rickless's high theory of forms, generalized in the Parmenides' higher theory into the axiom of Radical Purity, both of which Socrates is supposedly being taught to abandon in the dialectical exercise.

This dumbing down is also apparent in the way Rickless cashes out Plato's common description of the form of F-ness as being F auto kath' hauto in terms of the Itself-by-Itself axiom and the Separation theorem that follows from it in his reconstruction, viz. that every form is separate from the things that partake of it. The consequent failure to explore how the form of F-ness' being F kath' hauto is for it to be F in a specific manner, distinct from that in which sensible particulars are F, has disastrous consequences for Rickless's response to the Third Man Argument. In a startling move, he actually embraces the conclusion of the regress it generates, for he takes it to be one of the Parmenides' positive purposes to "establish the existence of infinitely many forms of F-ness, for at least some F's," which is tantamount to rejecting the theorem of Uniqueness (74). Few will want to go along with Rickless here, particularly when there are available ways of forestalling the regress. One is by attending to the distinction already adumbrated at Phaedo 100c4-6 (quoted above) between the way the form of F-ness is F and the way other things are F, namely, that the form is F kath' hauto whereas other things are F by participation in or in virtue of their relation to the form. The result is that the Third Man's generation of a regress by grouping the form of largeness together with particular large things is illegitimate. Despite the superficial similarity of their surface grammar, the statements "the sensible particulars x, y, and z are large" and "Largeness is large" are to be logically analyzed in different ways.

One of the book's major shortcomings is that it is so little interested in Plato's distinction between different types of predicate that is so critical to understanding the Parmenides. Rickless is largely dismissive of Constance Meinwald's argument, in Plato's Parmenides (New York and Oxford, 1991), that the key distinction for resolving the apparent contradictions of the dialectical exercise is that between what she terms pros ta alla and pros heauto predication. Even if one does not agree with her development of this distinction, the fact remains that there is some distinction along the lines of the one signaled at Sophist 255c12-13, where the Eleatic Visitor indicates that some things are said kath' hauta while others are always said pros alla. In the Parmenides' dialectical exercise, most notably in its Second Deduction, Plato systematically develops the idea that there are different types of predicate or different ways or respects in which a subject may have various properties. There prove to be four ways in which properties belong to the One: (i) in relation to itself and in virtue of its own nature; (ii) in relation to itself but not in virtue of its own nature; (iii) in relation to the others and not in virtue of its own nature; and (iv) in relation to the others and in virtue of its (and their) own nature(s). The apparently contradictory properties attributed to the One in the Second Deduction, therefore, are not genuinely contradictory, for they belong to it in different respects.

Rickless's exposition of the arguments of the Second Deduction in Chapter 5, however, hardly takes account of these crucial distinctions. This is because Rickless takes the deduction simply to be demonstrating that, if the One is, then it is both F and con-F, which is tantamount to a demonstration that the axiom of Radical Purity is false. It is natural to think that the Parmenides satisfies the expectation raised by the youthful Socrates' insistence that it would be truly remarkable if someone were to show that the forms themselves admit in themselves opposite attributes (Prm. 129c1-3) and that they are in themselves capable of combining and separating (129e2-3), so that the forms would be revealed as involved in the same complexities to which Zeno showed sensible particulars to be subject (129e5-130a2). Rickless argues that this expectation is borne out in the dialectical exercise in a manner that demonstrates the need to abandon the axiom of Radical Purity, the theorems of Purity and Uniqueness, and the auxiliary principle of No Causation by Contraries. This is a provocative new view worthy of taking its place alongside other interpretations of the dialogue's overall purpose. There remain, however, good reasons to resist the claim that the dialectical exercise shows the One to be involved in the type of complexity and contradiction that would involve revision of the hypothesis of forms as radical as Rickless proposes.