Platonism at the Origins of Modernity: Studies on Platonism and Early Modern Philosophy

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Douglas Hedley and Sarah Hutton (eds.), Platonism at the Origins of Modernity: Studies on Platonism and Early Modern Philosophy, Springer, 2008, 285pp., $169.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781402064067.

Reviewed by Eric Schliesser, Leiden University


Anybody who teaches Early Modern philosophy and science will come across some strange concepts like emanative causation, cosmic sympathy, the theory of expression, formal and eminent existence, the great chain of being, etc. Some very familiar arguments in Descartes' Meditations or Leibniz's Monadology are barely intelligible without a proper understanding of such Platonic concepts. Spinoza's Ethics is notoriously difficult, but who has not paused at proposition 9 (of part 1), "The more reality or being a thing has the greater the number of its attributes," not to mention its mysterious reference to definition IV -- only to be overwhelmingly relieved to discover that it does not appear to be used in any subsequent proof and can, thus, safely be ignored? Those of us who read secondary literature as we prepare reconstructions of arguments to present to our students (or to anticipate pesky questions of those students that might do the readings carefully) know there is remarkably little scholarship on such funky concepts. Unscientific sampling of my peers has made me suspect that folks simply pretend away many of the interpretive problems such concepts and claims presupposing them generate.

Moreover, if one does scholarly work in the history of physics one will notice all kinds of Platonizing elements in canonical figures of the scientific revolution: from outright mysticism in Kepler's writings, prominent allusions to Plato in Bacon, Galileo's use of the dialogue form, and the nature of formal causation within mathematics to Newton's reflections on the nature of space in the increasingly important scholarly rediscovery of "De Gravitatione" (lovingly known as 'DeGrav'). Well into the eighteenth century, the leading Scottish Newtonian, Colin MacLaurin, was deploring Platonizing tendencies in the opponents of Newton.[1] Anybody familiar with Hobbes' or Rousseau's political writings will recognize Plato as an important interlocutor; the same is true of Swift's Gulliver's Travels. There is some excellent specialist literature on these topics, but it is often disconnected from broader interpretive frameworks and makes little impact on contemporary early modern scholarship. This is in striking contrast to the hotly debated nature of the Augustinian influence on Descartes[2] or the renewed interpretation of the enduring importance of Scholasticism;[3] many scholars will routinely invoke Stoic influence on Spinoza,[4] the central importance of Epicurean materialism in Hobbes and Gassendi, or the importance of the revival and reformulation of classical Pyrrhonism in the works of Montaigne, Bayle, and Hume.[5] Yet, despite Whitehead's famous quip that "the safest general characterization of the European philosophical tradition … [is that is] consists of a series of footnotes to Plato,"[6] Plato and Platonism receive little attention in discussions of Early Modern (and Modern) philosophy.

Sarah Hutton has been a tireless advocate for the importance of Platonism to Early Modern philosophy, with well regarded studies and editions of Cudworth, Henry More, Margaret Cavendish, and Anne Conway, among others. I was eager to read and review this volume. Unfortunately, even the Early Modern specialist will find it hard going. Too many of the papers are interventions on one side or other in ongoing niche debates that will be of little interest to outsiders. They will be out of reach of most students' comprehension. Hutton and Hedley have chosen a "more or less chronological" (6) presentation of essays on individual authors. Unfortunately, there is a striking imbalance in the subject matter discussed; there are (at least) three papers directly dealing with Cudworth, but none with Kepler, Newton, Rousseau, Bacon, Hobbes, Montaigne, Cavendish, or Galileo.[7] I am all for broadening the philosophical canon and am willing to accept Hutton's judgment that Cudworth was the "central figure of Cambridge Platonism" (7). But why include a paper on "Robert Fludd's Kabbalistic Cosmos" and none at all on Bruno? Comenius and Lord Herbert get entries but there is none on Malebranche, Henry More (one of the "leading Platonists" in Stuart Brown's apt words, 239), or even Cavendish. Matters are not helped by the lack of a subject index. Unfortunately, the editors offer a terse summary of all the papers, but they have chosen not to offer a taxonomy or conceptual guide to the study of Plato and Platonism in the Early Modern period.

Despite the imbalances in coverage and the varying quality of the contributions, the volume has some papers very much worth reading. Dermot Moran on Nicholas of Cusa introduces renaissance Platonism; Laurent Jaffro on Shaftesbury's melancholic defense of the Ancients against the Moderns and Leslie Armour on Cudworth's conception of divine love and toleration offer genuinely accessible and stimulating papers. Nevertheless, I highly recommend that the reader first turn to Christia Mercer's clearly written, "The Platonism at the Core of Leibniz's Philosophy," which does not shy away from the sheer strangeness of many Platonist doctrines while diagnosing why they may have seemed attractive, even obvious, to a first rate thinker. Mercer usefully identifies "four Platonist doctrines" that she finds at the core of Leibniz's thought:

[I] the "theory of emanative causation," which claims that,

for a being A that is more perfect than a being B, A can emanate its attribute f-ness to B in such a way that neither A nor A's f-ness is depleted in any way, while B has f-ness, though in a manner inferior to the way it exists in A. The emanative process is continual so that B will instantiate f-ness if and only if A emanates f-ness to it. (228)

[II] The "Creaturely Inferiority Complex," which

asserts that every product of the supreme being contains all the attributes which constitute the divine essence though the product instantiates each of those attributes in a manner inferior to the way in which they exist in the supreme being. (228)

[III] The "relation of Sympathy, which can be more or less, claims that each created being corresponds to the activity and states of all the beings" (228).

[IV] The fourth doctrine is epistemic in character and has three elements:

(1) that the mind is the object of knowledge in the sense that it contains the eternal truths or Ideas; (2) that the mind, which is mutable and finite, will become aware of those objects only if it both turns away from the material world and is aided by divine light; and (3) that it is the intellect or understanding that is capable of grasping those truths" (229).

This list immediately reveals, first that Leibniz's Platonist commitments spread deeply into epistemic and ontological matters; and second that they are a way of handling both the connectedness of all things and the hierarchies among them. As Mercer aptly quips, "Pre-established harmony just is emanation and sympathy perfectly organized."

In her argument, Mercer quotes from Discourse on Metaphysics 14: "it is very evident that created substances depend upon God, who preserves them and who even produces them continually by a kind of emanation, just as we produce our thoughts" (226; emphasis added). It is similar in structure to Newton's claim (in "DeGrav") that space is "as it were an emanative effect of God" (emphasis added).[8] Now Mercer cannot be faulted for not pursuing the Newton connection; in "DeGrav" Newton explicitly denies that space is a substance and perhaps Leibniz would be unwilling to count space as a thing at all. But I was struck by the fact that both Leibniz and Newton appeal to emanation as an analogy (unremarked upon by Mercer) and, thus, presuppose in their audience broad familiarity with the very idea of emanative causation in order to make their own views clear.[9] This suggests that well into the second half of the seventeenth century, appreciation of Platonist views was presupposed in a learned audience.

Finding this presupposed familiarity in the second (or, if one prefers, third) generation of self-consciously "Modern" philosophers who are firmly enshrined at the core of the scientific revolution should not surprise. Even Marjorie Grene once grudgingly admitted that Newton and Leibniz's common target, Descartes, employs an "emanative cast" in the third Meditation and that "levels of reality talk recurs in the fourth Meditation … and of course the Fifth."[10] Thus, it is a real shame that in her judicious contribution, comparing the Timaeus and the Meditations, Catherine Wilson does not explore the 'emanative cast' at all. In fact, she claims that Descartes is "best seen as a Democritean philosopher and as an exponent of what might be termed neo-Alexandrian experimental physiology" (180). Wilson's anti-Platonizing reading of Descartes is summed up nicely by this:

While Descartes seemed to reserve some forms of knowledge for a disembodied mind, the Meditations as a whole seem intended to reintroduce into natural philosophy an essentially Galenic, physiological conception of what it is to be an animated thing. (185)

According to Wilson, Descartes' apparent Platonism is a kind of useful window-dressing:

An admixture of Platonism adorned the mechanical philosophy with moral-theological features that helped to redeem it from its association with atheism and that enabled it to compete… within the universities with scholastic-Aristotelian natural philosophy. (190)

Yet, the discerning reader will find that the "the author of the Meditations and the Principles of Philosophy finds no ethical messages in its survey of the heavens and the human body" (191). In a recently published piece, John Cottingham, who does pick up on the "downward cascade of being from perfection to the lower realms," also reaches a similar conclusion.[11] Fair enough; it is good to know that Descartes' ethical orientation is different from the one contemporary scholars discern in the Timaeus (although one would have wished for some reflection on Bacon's fascinating appropriation of the Timaeus in New Atlantis if only to caution 'our' confidence in how Plato would have been read by Descartes' contemporaries). While I am a huge fan of her scholarship, here Wilson makes things too easy for herself by ignoring the 'emanative cast' altogether.

That Wilson has missed an opportunity is suggested by Han van Ruler’s too-brief survey of "Platonic themes in Dutch Cartesianism," which calls attention to Geulincx's (and Spinoza's) willingness to plumb the depths of Platonism:

Geulincx wanted to establish a metaphysical distinction between the permanent entities of Mind and Body on the one hand, and their 'modal' spatio-temporal manifestations on the other. It is, moreover, in order to establish this distinction that he refers to Plato, whose notion of being and becoming implied that 'the World' and everything in it are temporal things and belong to the modal realm, of which Plato had said that they are 'partly existent and partly non-existent'. (Van Ruler quoting Geulincx citing Plato, 171)

Geulincx is echoing and making coherent Descartes's (infamous) 'Synopsis' of the Meditations, where Descartes had distinguished between body as a substance and body as an 'accidental' manifestation of that substance. Of course, once the 'synopsis' of the Meditations (often omitted in contemporary editions) is taken as authoritative, echoes of Plato's cave can be discerned easily in a host of thinkers. As van Ruler observed about Geulincx: "Wholes and parts, like substances, accidents, relations, predicates and even a concept such as 'thing', are nothing but phasmata of our intellect, projected onto the world and thereby fundamentally disfiguring it" (170 n 40). Even Spinoza does not go this far when he argues that the (perishable) imagination is constitutive of our tendency to conceive ('modal') distinctions in what the (immortal) intellect perceives as homogeneous matter (see the long note to E1P15 and E5P40). Although in much recent writing Spinoza has become the hero of a kind of hard-core, no-nonsense (scientific) naturalism, we can discern in him a two-aspect-view of reality if only we are willing to notice how for Spinoza the intellect perceives no genuine change. (I suspect Spinoza's oft-ignored interest in Zeno's paradoxes may play a role here.)

From these remarks one might conclude that only Rationalist intellectual extravaganzas led to Platonizing themes,[12] but one of the most attractive features of this volume is that some of the best pieces are on so-called Empiricists. Stuart Brown very competently explores (not entirely surprising) similarities between Leibniz's and Berkeley's views. More provocatively (especially in light of Leibniz's tendency to identify Locke's views with Aristotle’s), Victor Nuovo and G.A.J. Rogers call attention to Platonizing themes in Locke. Rogers does a lot of careful, contextual detective work to show that "Locke and the Cambridge Platonists are not nearly so far apart as standard histories of philosophy make them appear" (205). But Nuovo's piece is more hard-hitting because while drawing on well-known passages of Locke's Essay, it explicitly identifies a principle

considered to be hallmark of Neo-Platonism, that a cause is always greater (that is, higher in the chain of being) than its effects and that effects aspire, so to speak, to the greater perfection of their cause; he believed that spirit or consciousness is separable from its terrestrial vehicle and that by divine action it can be fitted with an incorruptible vehicle. Taken all together, these … cohere in a kind of religious Platonism. (214)

In reading Nuovo's excellent piece, I would have welcomed, perhaps, some of Catherine Wilson's deflationary attitude toward the overall importance of Platonizing proofs for the existence of God. Now the volume implies that when it came to substantive metaphysics, Locke was more of a Platonist than Descartes, an irony worthy of Socrates.[13]

[1] Colin MacLaurin (1748) An account of Sir Isaac Newton's Philosophical Discoveries, London: Millar, 51.

[2] Stephen Menn (2002) Descartes and Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Of course, Menn's work also calls some attention to Platonizing elements in Descartes.

[3] Roger Ariew (1999) Descartes and the Last Scholastics, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

[4] Susan James (1993) "Spinoza the Stoic," The Rise of Modern Philosophy, edited by Tom Sorrell, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 289-316.

[5] Richard H. Popkin (2006) "Scepticism" in The Cambridge History of eighteenth-century Philosophy, edited by Knud Haakonssen, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 426-450.

[6] Alfred North Whitehead (1929) Process and Reality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 39. It is paraphrased by Sarah Hutton in her Introduction to the volume under review, 1. Whitehead may be echoing Nietzsche here.

[7] The omission of major figures of the scientific revolution appears to be due to Douglas Hedley's superficial belief that the 'New Science' was opposed to "Platonism" (270; Hedley is a co-editor of the volume). For a useful correction, see Ed Slowik's fine "Newton's Neo-Platonic Ontology of Space" (under review).

[8] See Isaac Newton (2004) Philosophical Writings, edited by Andrew Janiak, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 21.

[9] This is not to deny that Newton is willing to endorse the claims that a) "space is an emanative effect of the first existing being" (Newton 2004, 25) and b) space "is the emanative effect of an eternal and immutable being" (26); most commentators do not hesitate to equate the first existing, eternal and immutable being with God, but we cannot pursue the issue here.

[10] Marjorie Grene (1999) Descartes, Indianapolis: Hackett, 102.

[11] John Cottingham, "Plato's Sun and Descartes's Stove" in Rationalism, Platonism, and God, edited by Micahel Ayers, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 29.

[12] Cf. the reference to the volume edited by Ayers in previous note.

[13] The author has benefited from comments by Alison Simmons on an earlier draft.