Plato's Persona: Marsilio Ficino, Renaissance Humanism, and Platonic Traditions

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Denis J.-J. Robichaud, Plato's Persona: Marsilio Ficino, Renaissance Humanism, and Platonic Traditions, University of Pennsylvania Press, 2018, 344pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780812249859.

Reviewed by Anna Corrias, University of Queensland


Denis J.-J. Robichaud's comprehensive study of Marsilio Ficino (1433-1499)'s engagement with Platonic philosophy is an impressive scholarly work which makes a significant contribution to our understanding of the changes and transformations, as well as of the philosophical continuity, which characterize the Platonic tradition.

The concept of 'persona', around which this study is constructed, has a long tradition in the history of Western thought, and is fundamental not only to define what we understand today as the philosophical identity of an author, but also -- and even the more so -- to comprehend how this identity changed through time. For in most cases, the affection of disciples and the admiration of readers, together with different translation choices and hermeneutical approaches, contributed to create diverse, and historically conditioned, perceptions of ancient philosophers. This is particularly true for Plato, whose enormous appeal and complex reception history resulted in the creation of a 'Platonic persona' in which his philosophical personality merged with those of his late ancient commentators. Interestingly, Robichaud shows that this persona was not only informed by later interpreters but also by contemporary authors, such as the Pythagorean Philolaus of Croton, not to mention earlier philosophers, such as Zoroaster and Pythagoras himself.

In fact, the 'Pythagoreanization of Plato', as Ilsetraut Hadot would have it,[1] had far-reaching consequences if we think that in his On the Art of the Kabbalah, published in 1517, Johannes Reuchlin defines Socrates and Plato as 'the first Pythagoreans of all'. Reuchlin also claims that they taught their disciples 'clearly following their master Pythagoras . . ., for they had heard Pythagoras speaking of matters divine, something he always did in obscure terms.'[2] Platonic scholarship has a long history of transformations in which Plato's masks (or personae) enabled him to act right at the center of an ideal process of historical genealogy and doctrinal filiation. The famous rescue mission of Johann Jakob Brucker (1696-1770), Wilhelm Gottlieb Tennemann (1761-1819) and, above all, Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768-1834) was aimed exactly at restoring Plato's original identity, disentangling it from his previous masks. Robichaud's book reconstructs some important chapters in this history.

The hermeneutical traditions that contributed to craft Plato's masks converge in the splendidly unified revival of Platonism effected in the fifteenth century by Ficino. In fact, Ficino is the author most responsible for the development and later influence of the 'Platonic persona', which goes far beyond the Plato of the dialogues. He produced the first Latin translation, along with commentaries, of the entire Platonic corpus, published in 1484. In the same year he started to work systematically on Plotinus's Enneads, of which he published a Latin translation and a commentary in 1492. Alongside his work on Plotinus, Ficino paraphrased Iamblichus's On the Mysteries of the Egyptians and produced Latin versions of Porphyry's On Abstinence, Synesius's On Dreams and portions of Proclus's commentary on Plato's First Alcibiades and On the Hieratic Art. As Robichaud convincingly observes, he 'was the key intermediary between Greek and Latin, as well as between manuscript and print' (p. 3). Ficino's works show a close and continuous engagement with the 'persona' of the Platonic philosopher (Plato, the later Platonists, but also the Pythagoreans and even himself as Plato's Renaissance spokesman), and this book does an excellent job at showing the complexity of the hermeneutic circle that shaped his understanding of Platonic identity. In Robichaud's own words, his study examines 'Ficino's appropriation of Plato and Platonisms to form a Plato, who in turn becomes the primary Plato of the Italian (and later) European Renaissance' (p. 19). The significance of this approach for the history of philosophy is beyond doubt.

The first chapter discusses what Robichaud describes as Ficino's 'prosopopoeic approach' and shows him 'in the process of crafting a rhetorical mask for philosophical purposes' (p. 26). With great attention to the details and nuances of language, Robichaud examines the semantic changes of the ancient Greek word prosopon from its original use as 'face' and 'mask', both denoting the true self of the person, to the distinction between an external -- concealing -- and an internal -- concealed -- prosopon which, in Plato's philosophy, reflects the amphibious nature of reality. The Latin translation of prosopon as 'persona' standardized this distinction, emphasizing the rhetorical contrast between the literary self and one's personal identity. Robichaud shows the central part that this distinction had in Renaissance debates concerning the role of rhetoric in shaping rational arguments and claims that prosopopoeia and 'enargeia', i.e., 'the fabrication and vivid presentation of personae' (p. 70), were fundamental ways in which the humanists explored and conversed with the past (p. 51). Through an analysis of carefully selected passages from his epistolography, Robichaud shows that Ficino's prosopopoeia is deeply embedded in the principles of his philosophy and attentively crafted for his project of reviving Plato's persona. Friendship and philosophical love inspire Ficino's letters, while his interlocutors become means for self-knowledge, and, ultimately, self-intuition -- a highly Plotinian experience. Writing to his friend Giovanni Cavalcanti (1444-1509), Ficino says: 'But if I seek myself in another, how will I apprehend myself? If I do not have myself through which alone I am able to grasp whatever I am able to grasp. Therefore, return and give yourself, or rather myself, back to me' (p. 56). In this splendid example, the role of the addressee is not only rhetorical; for through his dialogic presence, he enables the writer to become reunited with his inner self. As Robichaud has it:

In his letters, Ficino engages in a discursive process of self-knowledge whereby before one turns inward towards one's own spirit or inner self, one seeks oneself in another person, just as though one were to look at one's face in the mirror; that is, he enacts Socrates's claim in the Phaedrus (255d) that the lover sees himself in his beloved. (p. 57)

By turning inward, the soul could eventually return to the divine, in a distinctively Platonic way. In Ficino's epistolography the interplay between the persona of the writer and that of his interlocutor -- and thus the discursive nature of self-knowledge through letter writing -- is grounded in the principles of emanative metaphysics; moreover, both the writer and the interlocutor are rhetorical personae devised to revive, embody and promote the paradigm of Platonic identity.

The second chapter attempts, with much success, to prove that Iamblichus's De secta Pythagorica was a potent source of inspiration for Ficino since the early years of his Platonic career. After discarding less plausible hypotheses, Robichaud argues that it was by following Iamblichus that Ficino arranged the Platonic dialogues he translated for Cosimo de' Medici in the specific order in which they are found in MS. Oxford, Bodleian Library, Canon. Class. Lat. 163. Ficino's early acquaintance with De secta Pythagorica had been already demonstrated by Sebastiano Gentile.[3] However, both here and in chapter 4, Robichaud introduces and discusses important evidence that contributes to our understanding of the formative influence of Iamblichus and Pythagoras on Ficino's thought. Ficino, Robichaud argues, follows especially the Protrepticus, the second volume of the De secta Pythagorica, and arranges the dialogues in an order that is aimed at preparing the soul to depart from earthly life and become blissfully happy in the divine world.

In this context, Robichaud discusses Ficino's knowledge and possible use of two so-called 'Middle Platonic' philosophers, Alcinous and Albinus, whose personae as interpreters of Plato might have had a significant impact on Ficino's own hermeneutical approach. The role of the Platonists of this generation in the shaping of Ficino's philosophy merits a systematic study, to which this chapter, no doubt, makes an initial contribution.

In uncovering Plato's philosophical personality for his Latin readers, Ficino, as Robichaud explains, 'follows not only in Pythagoras's lofty footsteps but also in Socrates's barefoot tracks' (p. 112). Chapters 3, 4, and 5 examine Ficino's view of the three rhetorical masks that embody Plato's identity in the dialogues: Socrates, Pythagoras, and Plato himself. Ficino's Socrates, as well as Plato's Socrates, is keen to show the role of love in initiating the soul's ascension to the divine, the final goal of philosophy. However, he refers to a metaphysical system that is strongly post-Platonic and in which Eros, as the personification of love and of Socrates himself, 'is the first and highest leader of the first being's conversion (conversio) to God -- that is, the first being below the One, the Intellect' (p. 126). Robichaud, unlike other scholars, claims that Ficino's Socrates is not concerned about describing the soul's conversion to the divine (έπιστροφἡ) in terms of a Christian spiritual ascension. In fact, he says, Ficino's De amore, written in 1469, keeps a strong Platonic perspective that suggests that Ficino 'has written a philosophical work on the deification of man that is based not on the mediation of Christ but on the mediation of love and the identification of goodness with radiant presence of beauty' (p. 129). In this work 'Ficino sets up Socrates as the godlike virtuous pagan philosopher and as the exemplar for imitation' and 'he does so in purely Platonic terms' (p. 132). However, it was not too long before Ficino re-depicted his Socrates if not as a committed Christian, at least as a Christianizing Platonist. Accused of having made Socrates a rival of Christ, he felt the urge to rewrite the character of Socrates in a letter addressed to the theologian Paolo Ferobanti that can be seen as 'something of an apology for the De amore's portrayal of Socrates' (p. 132). This chapter shows that the persona that Ficino had crafted for Socrates in the De amore -- the wisest of all men and an example for virtue, yet a pagan philosopher -- caused no little concern to his contemporaries. While previous scholarship has focused mainly on the strong criticism provoked by the De vita, Robichaud shows the controversial reception of the De amore. In general, he discusses the place of pagan philosophy in Ficino's thought, in the light of Ficino's own relationship with the Roman Curia, but also of his engagement with 'the dominant hermeneutical framework of Augustine that he inherited' (p. 21).

Chapter 3, on the role of Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans in shaping some important aspects of Ficino's Platonic persona represents is, I believe, the most original contribution made by this book. Even though previous research, especially works by Michael J. B. Allen and Christopher S. Celenza, already brought to light Ficino's fascination and engagement with Pythagoreanism, this chapter investigates the Pythagorean dimension of Ficino's Platonism in unprecedented depth. Robichaud claims that between the first century BCE and the first century CE, a hermeneutic circle links the 'prosopopoeic polyphonic interpretation of Plato's corpus' and the Doric Pythagorean pseudepigrapha and that Ficino is 'a later culmination of this approach' (p. 151). He puts forward a thorough analysis of Ficino's use of the 'Pythagoreans' (often identified as Timaeus of Locris, Philolaus, Archytas, Brotinus etc., but also, and perhaps more often, unnamed), which was aimed at emphasizing the continuity 'between Pythagorean wisdom and Platonic philosophy' (p. 153). In giving voice to these authors 'Ficino's goal, like Iamblichus, is to present a unitary source for Platonism, before Plato, in Pythagorean philosophy' (p. 179). Robichaud's compelling analysis is further supported by an appendix (pp. 245-46) that lists the different loci in Ficino's Opera omnia (Basel, 1576) where Pythagorean philosophers are mentioned. This chapter also shows the intriguing face of the Pythagorean mask worn by Socrates on different occasions, for, in Plato's dialogues, 'it is in a Pythagorean manner that Socrates becomes a composer of hymns and a mythmaker' (p. 161).

However, it was only Plato, that is, Plato behind the mask (or masks), who, for Ficino, could reveal the essential agreement between Platonism and Christianity, philosophical thinking and religious faith, which laid at the core of his philosophical project. Chapter 4 is devoted to identifying the nakedness of Plato's identity, stripped of all rhetorical disguise; in other words, as Robichaud would have it, his 'prosopon' versus his 'persona'. For 'in order for Ficino to locate Christian dogmas in Plato's teachings, he must first explain how and when (if at all) Plato offers his own explicit doctrines in the dialogues' (p. 189). In this context, an example, in particular, is especially representative of Robichaud's research approach, which often combines the method of the philologist with that of the historian of philosophy. In identifying the voice of Plato with that of the Athenian Stranger and with a masterly exercise of 'divinatory philology' (p. 197), Ficino interprets the two Greek textual variants to Laws 716c (εἴ που τίς and ἤν που τίς) so as to ascribe to the Stranger, that is, to Plato, a prophetic anticipation of the Incarnation. In Ficino's Latin translation, the famous claim that 'God is the measure of all things in the highest degree' implies that this degree is reached 'si Deus fiat homo', i.e., 'if God becomes a man' (p. 198). Hence, Robichaud concludes, for Ficino, 'revealing Plato's πρόσωπον as the Athenian Stranger also reveals Christ's πρόσωπον in Platonism' (p. 204).

This study is to be particularly praised for uncovering the meaningful interconnections between the different personae who contributed to writing the complex history of Platonic scholarship. In this history, Pythagoras, Socrates, and Plato -- in their masked as well as unmasked identities -- are in constant dialogue and keep informing one another's thought. This becomes especially evident in Ficino's distinctive 'thinking with tradition' (p. 231), to quote a particularly effective expression used by Robichaud. This 'thinking' was, perhaps, also informed by the organization of the Greek manuscript given to him by Cosimo and on which Ficino started to forge his own Platonic persona. This codex 'binds together various hermeneutical traditions into a phenomenological unity, which establishes certain horizons for Ficino's reading experience' (p. 79). It is within these horizons, which kept expanding as Ficino grew as a scholar, that Plato -- in his Pythagorean, Socratic and Platonic roles -- is compared to and even identified with the persona of Christ, who, alone, wears no masks.

The originality and pleasure of the book lie in its exploration of the history of philosophy as a dynamic process, in which different traditions of thought are to be regarded as many-sided and multi-layered rather than as monolithic phenomena. Robichaud shows this dynamism from the perspective of Ficino's philosophical world. However, he is to be thanked for bringing into light the key role that minor -- hence often neglected -- ancient and late ancient authors played in the shaping of the identity not only of the philosophers they interpreted (especially Pythagoras and Plato) but also of those of the Renaissance authors who, in turn, interpreted them. The use of the standard term 'Neoplatonism' could have been avoided, as it is now widely accepted that it does not reflect the true nature of late ancient Platonic philosophy, but rather the hermeneutical trends of the eighteenth-century German scholars who coined it. The choice of this label is especially infelicitous here, as Robichaud makes a convincing case for the fact that in the Renaissance the late ancient philosophers were simply 'Platonists' and he brilliantly describes what being a Platonist meant for Ficino. Having said that, the term 'Neoplatonism', as well as 'Middle Platonism', would certainly help a less specialised readership to identify the sources that are being discussed.

To conclude, this book makes a highly important contribution to different research fields, including the history of philosophy, the history of reading, Renaissance studies, and classical reception. It is impressively researched, drawing on a vast range of sources, both manuscript and printed, and relies on the author's philological competence and philosophical acumen. It certainly deserves to be widely read and discussed by scholars and students interested in the complex process of transformation and identity underlying the history of Western philosophy and of its leading and minor actors.

[1] I. Hadot, Athenian and Alexandrian Neoplatonism and the Harmonization of Aristotle and Plato, trans. by M. Chase, Leiden and Boston, 2015, p. 45.

[2] J. Reuchlin, On the Art of the Kabbalah, trans. by M. and S. Goodman, Lincoln and London, 1993, p. 151.

[3] Sebastiano Gentile, ‘Sulle prime traduzioni dal greco di Marsilio Ficino’, Rinascimento XXX (1990), pp. 57-104.