Plato's Philebus: A Philosophical Discussion

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Panos Dimas, Russell E. Jones, and Gabriel R. Lear (eds.), Plato's Philebus: A Philosophical Discussion, Oxford University Press, 2019, 285pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803386.

Reviewed by Sylvain Delcomminette, Université libre de Bruxelles


This volume launches the "Plato Dialogue Project" (PDP), which aims at gathering scholars every third year to scrutinize a single Platonic dialogue. Although it is not explicit, it seems clear that the project is intended to offer an alternative to the Symposium Platonicum (SP) organized every third year by the International Plato Society. The comparison between this volume and the one stemming from the recent SP devoted to the Philebus[1] is instructive. The SP volume collects more than fifty papers (only a selection of those delivered at the Symposium) of various lengths written in five languages by scholars from around the world, both junior and established, and working in different scholarly traditions, who have answered a call for papers. Their topics range over a large spectrum, from focus on specific passages to more general studies on the dialogue form, comparison between the Philebus and other dialogues or other thinkers, and the reception of the dialogue in antiquity and modern times. By contrast, the PDP volume gathers fifteen longer papers written in English by confirmed scholars working mainly in the same tradition (let us call it the "analytical" tradition, if that rather vague category still has any sense) who were invited to focus on a portion of the text, so that the whole dialogue is covered. The papers were presented and discussed during a meeting between the contributors and five other selected participants. The model is explicitly the very aristocratic Symposium Aristotelicum, although the PDP steering board fully recognizes "the fact that the Platonic dialogues pose a different and more complex interpretative challenge than do the various Aristotelian texts".

Both the SP and the PDP models have their advantages and their drawbacks. It is clear that the PDP produces a more consistent volume, in terms both of style and quality. On the other hand, it only represents one trend, certainly dominant, but far from the only one, in Platonic scholarship; if one looks for diversity and surprises, one should rather look to the SP. Moreover, the very principles on which the PDP is organized make it unlikely that it will become "a central research forum for Platonic scholarship", as the steering board presents its intention in the Preface, at least if one remembers that a forum is supposed to be a public meeting space for open discussion. This is not at all to say that such an undertaking does not have excellent justifications of its own; but one should not take it for what it is not, and it does not render the SP obsolete.

One way of retaining its centrality in the research field despite being (inevitably) located in a certain tradition is by taking into account all, or at least most, of the previous literature published about the dialogue studied -- not necessarily, of course, by discussing or even mentioning it extensively, but at least by not ignoring the problems and solutions it raised and by not limiting oneself to the English-speaking literature produced in the last decade. In a context of exponential inflation of scholarly publications, this has become an intellectual duty for any responsible scholar in order to prevent the machine from running completely out of control.

Some of the authors of the present volume do this work admirably, and their papers provide up-to-date and novel readings of central passages of the Philebus. Among those, I would especially point out Paolo Crivelli's original interpretation of the relation between the serious one-many problems at 15b and the method of collection and division described at 16c-17a, according to which the method does indeed offer a solution to those problems; Susan Sauvé Meyer's complex discussion of 20b-23b, which she claims should not be read as a refutation of hedonism, both for reasons internal to the dialogue and because the position it examines does not amount to hedonism as it is commonly described today; Satoshi Ogihara's minute reading of 31b-36c, where the discussion of desire gets the lion's share (as in the dialogue itself); Pierre Destrée's interesting defense of the translation of phthonos at 47d-50e as"envy"; James Warren's careful examination of pure aesthetic pleasures at 50e-53c, with special attention to what it means for something to be beautiful kath' hauto ; and Verity Harte's sophisticated account of the closing pages of the dialogue and their connection with the question of causality and responsibility. All these papers offer new insights which will bring much food for thought to all those Plato lovers who are struggling to understand this exceedingly difficult dialogue.

Other authors are less thorough in their treatment of the previous literature. As a consequence, they sometimes seem not to be aware that their worries or the interpretations they advocate have a previous history which it would have been interesting to take into account. For example, it is rather depressing to read Mary Louise Gill's suggestion (to my mind rightly rejected by the other contributors) that the mixtures gathered in the third genus distinguished by Socrates at 25b-26d need not be good (87-9), with only a perfunctory reference to three previous scholars, whereas this is actually one of the most discussed issues related to this passage since Henry Jackson (1882), and all the worries and arguments she signals have received extensive treatments that she does not mention. Similarly, it is a bit too easy to conflate all previous interpretations of false pleasures of anticipation as "standard interpretation since Damascius", as Panos Dimas does (132), given the number of competing accounts that have been proposed. I would have liked to read a confrontation between Dimas' own interpretation, according to which such pleasures are false not due to a predictive error about a future state of affairs but due to a hoped-for state of affairs that is not good for the agent (134-8), and the one earlier advocated by Cynthia Hampton,[2] with which it seems to me to have similarities.

One of the specific difficulties posed by Plato's texts is keeping an eye on the whole dialogue while focusing on a specific passage. The Philebus is especially challenging from this point of view: from antiquity onwards, the unity of the dialogue has been questioned, both in terms of structure (Galen is reported to have written a treatise On the transitions in the Philebus, now lost) and in terms of content (it mixes discussions in what would now be labelled ethics, methodology, metaphysics, psychology, epistemology, and aesthetics). The division of the text into short sections allotted to different scholars is not the best way to cope with this issue, and several of the essays appear a little too self-contained, with no or few references to the relation of the passage studied with the rest of the dialogue. Others, however, offer interesting suggestions on that point.

Regarding content, Katja Maria Vogt, in her chapter on 11a-14b, claims that the Philebus contains "a distinctive approach to ethics" which also leads to a "distinctive metaphysical project", because it focuses on good-making ingredients of a good human life and requires that one "metaphysically understand human lives" in a way which notably involves attention to plurality, mixtures and their causes, in addition to issues in philosophy of mind, psychology, and epistemology. Suggestive as it is, I wonder whether this way of formulating the problem, which takes for granted modern, or at least (post-)Aristotelian, divisions of philosophy, really does justice to Plato's project. One might think that Plato viewed these issues in a unity that precedes any distinction of this kind, and that this unity precisely finds its ground in the (Form of the) good: as its introduction in Book VI of the Republic shows (504d-509c), the good is at the same time what can make one's life happy and that whose Form is the principle of knowledge and being. Maybe the Philebus is just the place to look in order to understand the intrinsic unity Plato thought existed between what now appear to us irreducible fields.

The issue of structure is especially raised in the first chapter, by Sean Kelsey and Gabriel Richardson Lear, which does not focus on a specific section of the text, but purports to provide "an orientation to reading Plato's Philebus". Acknowledging that many difficult discussions of the dialogue do not seem to play any crucial role in the official arguments for the conclusion that "the" good is neither wisdom nor pleasure and that wisdom is better than pleasure, they suggest that the dialogue follows less a logic of demonstration than a "logic of exhibition": it purports to show that wisdom is better than pleasure by "making the nature of the two contenders manifest in a way that immediately alters [Protarchus' and the readers'] attitudes of admiration and trust" (13). A similar approach is displayed in Ogihara's paper, according to which Socrates' aim at 31b-36c is to familiarize Protarchus with Socrates' position by showing him how various workings of the soul are valued non-hedonistically, i.e., independently of their power to promote pleasure.

These suggestions are illuminating and could explain the presence and length of some parts of the dialogue. But one can wonder whether the best exhibition of wisdom would not be its actual display in the dialogue, rather than its mere description or glorification. In other words, if Socrates wants to "parade" wisdom, would not the best way be to put it into practice, notably by applying dialectic in a rigorous way to show us how it actually works? If that is so, then either Socrates fails to produce the best exhibition of wisdom in the Philebus or he does put it to use in the dialogue. If one chooses the second option, then the idea that the dialogue proceeds according to a "logic of exhibition" does not dispense with the need to investigate how the "methodological" and "metaphysical" passages are relevant for the discussion in a more integrated way.

Moreover, it seems to me that Kelsey and Lear admit too readily from the start that the apparent digressions in the dialogue, because they do not play an explicit role in the "official argument", do not in fact have any demonstrative function. On the contrary, one could suggest that they are at work, but implicitly, and that Plato left it to the readers to reconstruct the details of the demonstration. A similar observation can be made in relation to Harte's proposal that the Philebus "does exactly what it says on the tin": "nothing less, but also nothing more" (253). It is certainly a sound hermeneutical principle to search in the dialogue for what it explicitly claims to do; and any valid interpretation should at the very least try to show that it does "nothing less". But why could it not also do something more? What Socrates claims to do is addressed to Protarchus; but should we not distinguish between what the dialogue does for Protarchus and what it can do for the reader? It is clear that Protarchus is not an accomplished philosopher, and he himself acknowledges that he is unable to follow Socrates' most intricate developments. But could we not think that by writing that dialogue Plato had readers in view whose understanding could go beyond Protarchus'? Otherwise, why fill it with allusions to other dialogues (e.g., the Republic), in which the interlocutors of this one were not present, for example?

Let me try to show how attention to the implicit structure of the whole dialogue could help make sense of specific passages by focusing on a transversal issue touched by several of the contributors. Although it is not always recognized, the question of causality and responsibility plays a crucial role in the Philebus. It comes to the forefront at 22d, which signals a turning-point as the dialogue shifts to the question whether it is pleasure or intelligence that comes second after the mixed life, with which the good has just been identified. Meyer insists that 22d1-4 reformulates the competition between pleasure and intellect in terms of which of them is the (efficient) cause of the mixed life, and not in terms of the goodness of the mixed life (57-8). For her part, Harte suggests that 64c5-9 "refines the question of what is responsible for the mixed life as the question what is responsible for the goodness of that life and treats it as coordinate with the question of what is that life's good-making feature" (255-6). Russell E. Jones tries to reconcile them by suggesting that at 59d-64c, the question is rather what is responsible for producing the mixed life as good (236-7).

Actually, I think all three are right, although one has to admit that Plato deliberately plays on an ambiguity. First, since at 22a the mixed life has been identified with the good, to ask whether pleasure or intelligence is the cause of the mixed life is to ask which of the two is the cause of the good. Second, it is clear that the question about the cause of the mixed life does not concern the cause of the mixed life being a life, nor even the cause of it being a mixture in general, but rather concerns the cause of it being the life and the mixture it is, i.e., a good one. Third, just after 22d1-4, Socrates continues:

And on this point I would contend even more against Philebus that, whatever this mixed life has in it that makes it choiceworthy and good, it is not pleasure but reason that is more akin to it and more like it (22d4-8, Meyer's translation)

Here "what makes the mixed life good" could also be rephrased as "the cause of the good," but this time it corresponds, not to the producing cause of that life, but to its good-making feature; as Harte remarks (256n12), "cause" here corresponds to the simple-minded cause of the Phaedo. There is therefore a double ambiguity: the cause can refer either to a producing cause or to such a "simple-minded" cause, and the effect, i.e., the good, can refer either to the good life or to its goodness.

Up to this point I am in agreement with Meyer;[3] but whereas she seems to connect each cause to one and only one effect, I think both effects can be assigned to both causes: on the one hand, producing the mixed life is also producing its goodness, and on the other, Socrates says that the good-making features of the mixed life are "the cause of all mixture" (64d3-4) -- probably because a bad mixture is no mixture at all (64d11-e3). What we are facing are rather two different ways of raising the causality question concerning the same effect, i.e., in what I have called elsewhere the production perspective and the logical perspective. Now when it is raised about a product, the second way can only come after the first one: in order to reflect on the good-making features of some product, one has first to produce it.

It seems to me that this is exactly what is done in the dialogue and what its apparently useless bits are for -- even if rendering this explicit is for the most part left to the reader. After the ambiguous statement of the problem at 22d, Socrates develops an explicitly productive account of causation at 26e-27b, a passage whose importance is not sufficiently recognized -- and this volume is unfortunately no exception (Gill's treatment of it is one page long). There, the cause is identified with a poioun and a dēmiourgoun, which produce a mixture of peras and apeiron; and since all such mixtures, among which is the mixed life (27d), are good (pace Gill), it is also the producing cause of the good in both senses of the term. Now whereas pleasure is included in the genus of apeiron (27e-28a), nous (intelligence) is included in (or maybe even identified with) that cause, by means of a cosmological argument (28a-31a), for the understanding of which it seems to me crucial not to adopt Hackforth's suggestion of distinguishing between a "transcendent" and an "immanent" intelligence, contrary to what Hendrik Lorenz does in his paper. For the point is precisely that the cause (of the mixture and its goodness) is one of the ingredients present in the mixed life. The causal function of intelligence is confirmed by the classification of sciences (55c-59d), where, as Jessica Moss puts it, knowledge is interpreted as "in its essence a matter of measurement" (219). But Moss does not seem right to make an exception for dialectic, which on the contrary is identified with nous at 59c-d, i.e., according to the fourfold classification, with the cause of measurement itself. (In retrospect, this might also shed light on the connection between the description of dialectic at 16c-17a, which mentions peras and apeiria, and the fourfold classification at 23b-27c, a point on which Crivelli's paper is a little disappointing.) Hence the mixed life will be a mixture in which intelligence measures or limits pleasure (a process for the understanding of which I am not sure the cooking metaphor developed at length by Jones really helps), which can explain why at 52c-d, as Warren points out (188), pure pleasures, i.e., the pleasures later included in the mixed life, are described as having measure in them and thus belonging to the mixed class. And only when the production of the mixed life is completed can the question of causation be raised again at 64c -- but this time in a logical perspective.

Hence when one looks at what is actually done in the dialogue, not only explicitly but also implicitly, and even though Protarchus remains largely unaware of it, the Philebus might appear much more consistent and well-organized than when one limits oneself to what it says "on the tin"; and this might be because dialectic, as the science of measurement par excellence, is in fact fully on display throughout the dialogue. To read the dialogue this way, however, one has to keep an eye on the big picture, which is not easy when one has to focus on a specific portion of the text. In any case, the analysis of the parts will always remain a necessary first step; and for this task any reader of the Philebus will benefit from this excellent collection.

[1] John Dillon and Luc Brisson (eds.), Plato's Philebus: Selected papers from the Eighth Symposium Platonicum, Academia Verlag, 2010.

[2] See, notably, C. Hampton, Pleasure, Knowledge, and Being, SUNY Press, 1990, p. 54-64.

[3] I am a little puzzled that she suggests otherwise (58n11).