Plato's Protagoras: Essays on the Confrontation of Philosophy and Sophistry

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Olof Pettersson and Vigdis Songe-Møller (eds.), Plato's Protagoras: Essays on the Confrontation of Philosophy and Sophistry, Springer, 2017, 235pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319455839.

Reviewed by Evan Rodriguez, Idaho State University


The topic of this book is a timely one. As Olof Pettersson points out in the introduction, the study of Plato's defense of philosophy as contrasted with sophistry is an area with growing momentum and with much left unexplored. Those with a broad interest in Plato or in the Protagoras are likely to find some perspectives and ideas in this volume worth considering, especially in the final contribution by Paul Woodruff. Yet there is relatively little new analysis of the confrontation between philosophy and sophistry.

Plato's Protagoras is indeed an important dialogue for understanding the topic. Its namesake is a famous Greek intellectual and a leading figure of the sophistic movement. The dialogue depicts a lengthy conversation that he has with Socrates, including a series of intriguing methodological twists and dodges. Plato also uses an intricate framing that explicitly raises the question of what Protagoras really teaches, and implicitly raises the question of what a pupil might learn from Socrates instead. The majority of contributions in this volume, with a few exceptions discussed below, opt for a traditional reading whereby there is a clear distinction between Plato's Socrates, a moral exemplar with genuine ethical teachings, and Plato's Protagoras, who simply seeks to hide his hypocrisy long enough to receive a paycheck.

Plato himself seems to have been responsible for the negative associations we still have with the word 'sophist', and many interpreters have been quick to see a rather dismissive attitude towards these figures in the dialogues. Others, however, have highlighted the difficulty of finding a clear-cut contrast (that is, beyond the observation that sophists receive payment for their teachings while philosophers don't, a fact that may give pause to those of us in the present-day academy). Many have been hard pressed to find methodological differences: for example, in the Protagoras Plato's Socrates criticizes Protagoras for giving long speeches only to then give the longest speech of the dialogue himself. Some have looked to aim or intent instead, though this too is complicated by the fact that both Socrates and Protagoras seem ready to win the debate by almost any means. Given these complications in Plato's portrayal, not to mention the underlying historical realities, the traditional assumptions adopted throughout by the majority of the contributors are by no means a given.

The book is also unified by a general agreement in its approach to Platonic scholarship. The authors seek to illuminate the portrayal of Socrates and Protagoras by paying careful attention to details of the dramatic setting. A good example is Gro Rørstadbotten's "Turning Towards Philosophy: A Reading of Protagoras 309a1-314e2", which interestingly draws attention to the relatively young age of Socrates (the second youngest of any dialogue if we follow the dates offered by Debra Nails[1] as Rørstadbotten does) along with dramatic details of the opening scenes. This is a refreshing reminder in a literature that often treats Socrates as a timeless character, born from Plato's pen fully formed with his elenctic armor. Yet here, as elsewhere in the volume, these important clues are taken a step beyond what evidence warrants in the eyes of this reader. According to Rørstadbotten, Plato intends to portray Socrates' very birth as a philosopher: "by assuming that the dramatic date of the Protagoras is 432, this is arguably philosophy's first appearance in the distinctive form of the Socratic activity or Socratic questioning . . . the Socratic awakening in the Hippocrates section is related to the birth of the Socratic activity" (139). Socrates' perplexity at the end of the dialogue is then interpreted as his own self-conscious mystification at his transformation into a philosopher (142). These conclusions are hard to square with the historical evidence that Socrates was not the first to engage in this 'Socratic' activity (as Woodruff recognizes -- see below) and with the aporetic trope found in other dialogues as well.

The emphasis on dramatic context is often, though not always, seen in opposition to an approach that takes into account the success or failure of individual arguments. Knut Ågotnes puts it most provocatively in "Socrates' Sophisticated Attack on Protagoras" when he writes: "An implication of the interpretation I suggest in this article is that a reading of the Protagoras that focuses on the soundness of the exchange of statements and arguments between Socrates and Protagoras in a strict logical sense is less than fruitful" (27). Ågotnes suggests the familiar idea that Socrates' main goal is to reveal hidden contradictions within Protagoras' theory rather than put forward any idea of his own. Along the way he makes some helpful observations. For instance, he highlights the reputation that Callias has for seeking pleasure, which may indeed affect how we read the discussion of hedonism hosted in his basement (38).

In "The Science of Measuring Pleasure and Pain", Cynthia Freeland helpfully cites Jonathan Lavery[2] in distinguishing between 'Democritean' readings of the Protagoras that treat an individual passage in isolation, and 'Aristotelean' readings that look for the function of the passage within the whole. Of course this is not an exclusive or exhaustive dichotomy; a good example of a detailed argument reconstruction paired with a sensitivity to the context, and an exception to the general trend of the book, can be found in Hayden W. Ausland's "The Treatment of Virtue in Plato's Protagoras". Ausland carefully parses the argument for the unity of temperance and wisdom, revealing its logical structure while at the same time paying close attention to the rather unintuitive order in which individual premises are secured. He quite plausibly suggests that the order of argumentation reveals a strategy for securing certain concessions from Protagoras that might not be admitted otherwise.

As he puts it, Ausland does not defend a single thesis but rather explores various "philosophical-literary pathways not usually pursued" (72). Nonetheless it is a highlight of the volume for its unique perspective backed by textual evidence as well as for helpful points of engagement with the secondary literature. He offers a novel reading of the methodological interlude according to which different virtues are thematized from the perspective of different characters (66-68). Yet some of the matches between a character's contribution and the single virtue given are not entirely straightforward (e.g. Hippias and piety). He also provides an interesting note cataloging in some detail the history of the label 'Great Speech' as used in recent English literature to describe Protagoras' initial display. As it turns out, it was first introduced by Vlastos as an English translation of the German 'grosse Rede' though that could just as easily be translated 'long speech', with different connotations (52-53). While this in itself is unlikely to change one's understanding of the passage, it is helpful to be made conscious of any presuppositions brought to the text based on the labels we use.

Other helpful observations crop up elsewhere as well. Freeland draws attention to a series of interesting places where the idea of measurement appears before the famous art of measurement towards the end of the dialogue, as when Protagoras asks Socrates about the precise length that his speeches should be (127, referencing Protagoras 334d6-e3). Marina McCoy draws some interesting connections between the Protagoras and Aristophanes' Clouds, in particular the comic door-knocking scenes in either work (157). Vigdis Songe-Møller follows a paper by Marco Quintela in pointing out the surprising number of places where the Greek word 'φωνή' ('articulate sound' or 'voice') appears: the description of Hippocrates, the description of Protagoras and other sophists, the results of Prometheus' gifts to humankind, and no less than five occurrences in Socrates' transition away from the Simonides speech (168-173).

Yet, for the most part, the contributors set aside detailed textual analysis to see what conclusions can be reached by a general overview. Most often this takes the form of summarizing the conversational back-and-forth and drawing from this an interpretation of the characters' main intentions and relative moral standings. The result is often a glowing appraisal of Socrates and a rather harsh assessment of Protagoras. The Socrates that emerges is a skilled debater who is able not only to effortlessly best Protagoras in argument but also to simultaneously control the effect on his interlocutors and instill a proper understanding of true education in Hippocrates and in Plato's readers (e.g. 27-28, 82-91, 100, 119). Even Pettersson, who is less inclined to see a clear-cut distinction between the dialogue's two main characters, suggests that Protagoras is subtly trying to deceive the audience into thinking that his teachings are consistent with democratic principles, and that "Socrates sees it all along" (183). I found that this approach often strays too close to a reading of Socrates as 'Plato's secret agent' that G.R.F. Ferrari cautions against,[3] failing to distinguish between the action of the character, the perspective of the narrator (potentially biased in this case given that it is Socrates himself), and Plato's own crafting of the conversation as author. As for Protagoras, he is portrayed as 'easily distressed' (13), a 'weak debater' (27), 'impotent' (99), 'laughable' (103), 'devious' (39), and an 'enchanting coward' who 'cannot save anyone' (120) despite 'constant apprehension for his own safety' (118). His teachings are said to be 'of little philosophical interest' (24), 'nothing noble' (97) and 'illusory' (174), his speech a mere attempt to cover up obvious moral problems with those teachings (31). He is said to have become 'deeply uncomfortable' (161) and have gained no insight from the conversation (150).

McCoy does draw attention to the fact that Socrates, after criticizing Protagoras for speechifying, gives the longest speech in the dialogue (153; also recognized by Pettersson on 178), and Kristin Sampson points out that Socrates himself appears to argue sophistically, even being mistaken for a sophist by the doorman (200). It may be right that we should hold on to the sharp distinction between philosophy and sophistry by excusing Socrates' inconsistencies and reading his praise of Protagoras throughout the dialogue as ironical. But this is not an uncontroversial position. Why not think that the there is some truth behind that admiration on Socrates' or Plato's part, and see his criticisms and inconsistencies as playful, competitive goads? Why not think that the thematization of Socratic origins at the beginning of the dialogue suggests a Socratic or Platonic debt to Protagoras (as Pettersson hints on the second page of the introduction) rather than a clear-cut contrast? And why couldn't there be a more detailed story to be told about both similarities and differences in method and intent? In this and other respects there is less by way of acknowledging contravening evidence and addressing alternative viewpoints than one might have hoped. Pettersson, for example, offers a minority view in the volume that the conversation is portrayed as a failure, having strayed off its proper course of first addressing what virtue is. He cites Vasilis Politis' relevant 2012 article, but does not engage with Politis' opposing thesis. Politis argues that the question of what virtue is should not in fact have been raised before reaching the sort of aporia they have about its teachability, suggesting that this is in fact an appropriate course for a Socratic conversation.[4]

I also would have liked to see more engagement with the historical Protagoras. An independent understanding of the historical sophists themselves is crucial for the task of "understanding how Plato introduced and negotiated a new type of intellectual practice" as advertised on the back cover. Even for the more limited question of Protagoras' portrayal in the dialogue, understanding the historical Protagoras is still of central relevance. While it is difficult to know exactly Plato's intended audience, his contemporaries are likely to have been more familiar with Protagoras than we are today and to have seen Plato's portrayal accordingly. Noting the resonances and discrepancies with the historical figure might help us better understand Plato's own emphasis and his reasons for portraying Protagoras in the way he did. And Woodruff's mention of Aristoxenus' report that almost the entirety of the Republic was already contained within Protagroas' Antilogiai,[5] along with his plausible suggestion that "Protagoras is the grandfather of what Plato has given us as Socratic questioning",[6] is too tantalizing not to have been explored in greater detail. Woodruff and Pettersson are the only authors to even raise this possibility and it deserves much greater attention.

The editors save the best for last with Woodruff's 'Why Did Protagoras Use Poetry in Education?' In many respects it stands out as an exception to the general trends mentioned above, offering a close reading of Protagoras' use of the Simonides poem informed by the context of the dialogue as well as what we know independently about the historical figure. He argues that Protagoras used poetry to give students experience in creating clear and contradiction-free speech. This involved correcting poets in order to make them say what they really meant to say. The poet's true intention, then, was Protagoras' standard for interpreting poetry; Socrates' standard, by contrast, was the truth itself. He then offers some compelling guesses about how Protagoras used this to advance his own program of moral education, including the famous homo mensura doctrine, and draws worthwhile parallels with the Socratic elenchus. Given the volume's main theme, I would have liked to see the implications that this reading might have for understanding the dialogue as a whole spelled out in more detail.

Finally, a few comments about the overall production. The volume does not appear to be intended nor would it be the best first stop for a reader seeking a comprehensive discussion of or introduction to the topic of philosophy and sophistry in the Protagoras. There is no comprehensive bibliography in the end matter; each chapter contains its own individual list of references. The lists are of varying thoroughness and accuracy; those of Ausland (73-75) and Pettersson (196-198) are the most useful, though the latter is not free from potentially misleading misprints. There is frequent overlap between independent contributions and little acknowledgement of repetitions or connections between different chapters, which can be frustrating when reading the volume cover to cover (though Songe-Møller and Rørstadbotten do helpfully reference one another). The index is not always as helpful as it could be. For instance, it misleadingly lists only five entries under 'virtue' despite its being a frequent topic throughout the book, not least in Ausland's "The Treatment of Virtue in Plato's Protagoras", which does not receive a single mention.

The volume has a clear and attractive layout, though one encounters a distracting number of misprints. This includes frequent, sometimes systematic misspellings of Greek words (e.g. 'eubolia' for 'euboulia') and inconsistencies in the ways that Greek terms are referenced. Each author uses different standards for either directly quoting or transliterating the Greek, a single author at times switching from one convention to another (e.g. switching between using 'f' or 'ph' to transliterate the letter 'φ', or between quoting a word in its standard dictionary form vs. the declined or conjugated form in a particular instance). For those who do not read Greek this is likely to be disorienting, as it is then difficult to track when the same word is being used in different contexts. A few misprints may cause more serious confusion, e.g. 'prudence' for 'temperance' in Ausland's argument reconstruction (61) and 'Proclus' for 'Prodicus' (169).

Despite these drawbacks, the volume will hopefully inspire further research on this rich topic.

[1] Nails, D. The People of Plato. (Hackett, 2002).

[2] Lavery, J. Plato's Protagoras and the Frontier of Genre Research: A Reconnaissance Report from the Field. Poetics Today 28.3: 191 -- 246.

[3] Ferrari, G.R.F. "Plato the Writer." Epoché 19.2 (2015): 191-203.

[4] Politis, Vasilis. "What do the Arguments in the Protagoras Amount to?" Phronesis 57.3 (2012): 209-239. See esp. p.211 as well as Politis' book The Structure of Enquiry in Plato's Early Dialogues (Cambridge, 2015).

[5] Diogenes Laertius, Lives of the Philosophers 3.37 (cited on p.214).

[6] This is the closing sentence on p.226. The claim is also supported by Diogenes Laertius' testimony in Lives of the Philosophers 9.53 = DK 80A1.