Plato’s Statesman: A Philosophical Discussion

Plato S Statesman A Philosophical Discussion

Panos Dimas, Melissa Lane, and Susan Sauvé Meyer, Plato’s Statesman: A Philosophical Discussion, Oxford University Press, 2021, 293pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192898296.

Reviewed by Jeremy Reid, San Francisco State University


This collected volume reveals how far scholarship on the Statesman has progressed and sets the agenda for much future work. Panos Dimas, Melissa Lane, and Susan Sauvé Meyer wisely divide the text and apportion parts to the various authors, ensuring that discussion stays focused on what Plato wrote. What results is the equivalent of a rich and diverse commentary, and I highly recommend it. The volume fills the Statesman with life, highlighting its importance for understanding Plato and ancient philosophy more generally, making the book perfect for teachers who want to run graduate seminars which work through the text carefully and sequentially. One feature of the volume that is especially useful for experts working in the field is the attention that is paid to crucial issues in the Greek. Even so because the authorial focus remains on the assigned passages, scholastic debates never cloud the primary goal of explaining the text. In addition, Greek is transliterated so that all can follow along, and debates about secondary literature are mostly relegated to footnotes. It is thus hugely informative while remaining accessible to newer readers of the dialogue.

The volume starts with a helpful and concise introduction to the Statesman by Dimas, explaining the significance of the term politikos, the structure of the dialogue, its relation to the Republic (while the philosopher and the king exercise different skills, both “are grounded in the same theoretical fundament” (5)), the difficulties in determining precisely the date of composition, and ending with a discussion of the Statesman’s dramatic position between the Theaetetus, Sophist, and the elusive Philosophos. Dimas argues that Plato did not intend to write another dialogue defining the philosopher, but instead makes a compelling case that Plato’s substitution of the main speaker from Socrates to the Eleatic Visitor (somebody skilled in collection, division, and the other components of dialectic) shows us the philosopher methodologically; thus, though ‘philosopher’ does not get defined, we learn what is it to be a philosopher through these discussions (11–12).

Meyer elaborates on the structure and methods of the dialogue, highlighting key moments of the dialogue when new philosophical tools are introduced and explaining their significance (e.g., dividing through the middle, the use of myth and model, the distinction between causes and auxiliary causes). Meyer insightfully notes that the way division is used in the second half of the dialogue does not separate according to kinds to produce taxonomies as in the first half, but rather specifies the organizational hierarchy in the city (16–17). Though it is tempting to try to work out what the method of division is, Meyer argues that what we see is dialectical expertise in action, which “employs the kindred practices of collection and division, myth, and modelling at the appropriate times, and at appropriate length” (18). The Statesman thus shows us how the tools of dialectic can be employed for different purposes in inquiry.

Lane then ties the various chapters together into a satisfying narrative and summarizes the main conclusions, so I focus my reviewing energies here on the contributions I take to be especially thought-provoking and that I hope will prompt scholarly engagement.

Gavin Lawrence’s “Trailhead: 257a1–259d6” makes a compelling case that early moves in the Statesman reveal “the misleadingness of ordinary language in scientific investigation” (49) and how Plato starts to “prefigure distinctions between nominal and real definition[s]” (36). Because the Statesman focuses on expertise as the criterion for properly distinguishing roles in the city, the method Lawrence identifies shows how Plato better develops and deploys the Thrasymachean distinction between a true X and an X only-in-name (43), in turn distinguishing between somebody who publicly performs some role and somebody who is a genuine expert (49).

Fabián Mié’s “Defining the Statesman by Division: 259d7–268d4” tackles the question of what the first divisions accomplish. Mié takes the divisions to establish necessary features of the statesman but shows that the account is insufficient, being too general and inexact. But this does not mean that the method of division is abandoned or that divisions from the “core section” are incorrect (53). Mié nicely handles the puzzling distinction between “theoretical” (gnōstikē) and “practical” (praktikē) skills, and the classification of politikē among the former. This distinction divides skills which are achieved with the use of our bodies and those that consist primarily in judgment, so the statesman’s judgments are analogous to the commands of the master-architect (56). Mié also argues that the method requires an approximate grasp of the kinds being divided, but this does not preclude the divider from acquiring a more precise and “definitive epistemic state” through the exhaustive ordering process (61, 66), having discovered which divisions are the most revealing (69).

Gábor Betegh’s “The Myth and What it Achieves: 268d5–277c6” explores the place of myth in a dialectical context, arguing that myth “necessarily takes on a life of its own” such that it can “lead to very important insights” even though it lacks the “kind of precision and clarity that is characteristic of a dialectical procedure” (77). Given that the Statesman is in part an exploration of philosophical method, Betegh’s chapter persuasively argues that the myth is supposed to be confusing, noting Young Socrates’ initial enthusiasm and later confusion at the point where contemporary commentators have also been confused by the number and content of the cosmic phases (81). In that sense, the Statesman myth is unsuccessful: it obscures rather than clarifies the key point, and thus could not perform the educational goal myth needs to serve to be beneficial for the young (83). This chapter could easily become a favorite among those drawn to meta-issues in the Statesman and for those who want to explore the relationship between dialectic, rhetoric, and poetry.

In “Learning from Models: 277c7–283a9”, David Bronstein brings his characteristic clarity to how models figure in the Visitor’s method. He summarizes the account as follows:

M is a model of a content C for a target T if and only if (1) M and T share C in common, (2) M is more familiar and smaller or easier or more trivial than T, and (3) as a result of comparing M and T, one forms the true opinion that C is the same in M and T. (100)

This framework explains the significance of weaving as a model in the Statesman, because it reveals that the Visitor knows in advance that ‘caring’ and ‘intertwining’ are essential elements of both weaving and statecraft (104–106). This in turn provides the basis for explaining how the model furthers the inquiry: although one might know that caring and intertwining are essential elements in the skill, we need to understand the particular role those elements play in the overall organization and structure of the skill (110). Bronstein’s chapter continues an important theme in the volume: the teaching vs. inquiry debate about the Statesman is too simplistic—the interlocutors are inquiring, but there are central claims the Visitor knows that provide the basis for further epistemic progress (112–114).

In “Plato on Normative Measurement: 283b1–287b3”, Rachel Barney shows how Plato makes a substantive response to Protagoras and the sophists, resulting in a fascinating debate about what measurement consists in and how to employ it correctly. On Barney’s reading, the measuring art involves both a comparative quantitative component, which arranges the comparanda in terms of more and less, and a normative component, which measures the item relative to due measure or what is appropriate (118–120). Barney emphasizes that in the practical realm and in all the crafts normative measurement is paramount; consequently, judgments in ethics and politics are of a kind with familiar practical activities and skills. Thus, many of the features that characterize mundane exercises of measurement provide the basis for objectivity in ethics and politics (125, 134). Barney then connects the Visitor’s remark about his speech conforming to due measure with the sophists who make similar claims, especially as they are said to have discovered the art of measurement and to have the ability to craft speeches that conform to these normative dimensions (132–133). This chapter is a must-read for anybody interested in moral realism in Plato, and makes a major contribution to the debate about whether there is a difference between moral and non-moral normative judgments in ancient ethics.

Amber Carpenter’s “Civic Function and the Taxonomy of Skills: 287b4–290e9” does an admirable job of explaining the significance of an often-overlooked passage. Carpenter makes explicit the distinction between causes (aitiai) and co-causes (sunaitia), “according to whether their activity is a constitutive part of the process of realizing the shared end (causes), or whether it is merely instrumentally necessary for the end to be realized, but no part of the process of realizing that end (co-causes)” (140–141). A particularly astute part of the chapter was Carpenter’s argument that the way the various crafts are split apart and lumped together is all done relative to the end of city-making, which has the result of ordering the crafts in ways that would have been deeply strange to actual practitioners of those crafts (146–147)—a nice complement to Lawrence’s point that ordinary language can be a poor guide to dialectic.

For me, the highlight of the volume is Franco Trivigno’s “Above the Law and Out for Justice: 291a1–297b4”. Trivigno’s project is to specify how the true statesman is to be distinguished from nearby claimants to the title, especially those sophists who look like they are engaging in the same activities as the statesman. Trivigno argues that we can best make sense of the Visitor’s argument by making a distinction between the criterion for right rule, which is definitional and explains what makes right rule right, and marks of right rule, which are “typical but not inevitable” features of right rule (157). Political knowledge that aims at making the city better is the criterion of right rule, whereas rule according to law and with the consent of the citizens are marks of right rule, in that they “typically facilitate” right rule, but can be present in political rule without knowledge and can be absent in political rule with knowledge (157). The upshot of this reading is that it may be impossible to perceive—especially from the perspective of the ruled—whether the ruler is a statesman or a sophist, but it does not follow from this that there is no important difference in the normative status of each kind of rule (158–159, 163). Trivigno provides resources for resolving a number of contested issues in the scholarship about the priority of knowledge in politics, the rule of law, the use of persuasion, citizen benefit as a goal, and Plato’s assessment of the epistemic condition of the ruled.

Christoph Horn’s “Ruling With (and Without) Laws: 297b5–303d3” builds off Christopher Rowe’s provocative article “Killing Socrates: Plato’s Later Thoughts on Democracies” and continues in a similar vein, interpreting the arguments about law in this part of the Statesman as a strong condemnation of the historical Athens and its democratic practices (179, 192–193). Horn is especially worried about “mere legalism” (186) or “a stupid sort of following of traditional rules” (188), and finds little of value in law-abiding constitutions other than their ability to produce true belief (doxa) haphazardly (181, 191), especially if a desideratum of a good legal framework is that the laws are dynamic (186). Horn states many of his claims very forcefully, and there is much to push back on for those of us who think that Plato has more nuanced and consistent views about the importance of law-abidingness and the value of various kinds of non-ideal constitutions.

Lane’s “Statecraft as a Ruling, Caring, and Weaving dunamis: 303d4–305e7” pins down the definition of the statesman by bringing together the discussions of dunameis from Republic V and the Sophist with this passage of the Statesman, arguing that the

Dunamis-Name, the logos which gathers together key threads of the dialogue—the statesman as ruling, caring, and weaving—and programmatically sums up their interrelationship in justifying the name of politikē, should be seen as the final and complete account, or definition, of statecraft. (197)

Specifically, the definition of politikē is the power (dunamis) of ruling, exercised with a caring orientation to accomplish the work (ergon) of political weaving (216). Lane’s chapter builds on her earlier work on the subordinate magistracies, adding further metaphysical precision and providing a satisfying explanation as to how the inquiry about the statesman concludes.

In “Weaving together Natural Courage and Moderation: 305e8–308b9”, Rachana Kamtekar argues that one of Plato’s projects in the discussion of natural character types is “to disentangle the evaluative and non-evaluative components of thick ethical concepts” (220). Kamtekar sheds valuable new light on Plato’s metaethics and reveals the depth of his thinking about how people apply evaluative terms. One particular highlight of this rich chapter is Kamtekar’s problematization of the sense in which the parts of virtue are opposed to each other, bringing together passages from across the Platonic corpus where one kind of mereological opposition is commonplace, thus focusing our attention on the particular kind of opposition the Visitor is trying to account for, namely how “the very property the members of a kind have in common . . . is one which the members can share in opposite ways” (223). Another highlight is Kamtekar’s use of the normative measurement passage to respond to Rosalind Hursthouse's critique of quantitative understandings of the mean, showing how the quantitative elements can be made sense of in ethical contexts (232). Finally, this chapter does much to explain Plato’s account of the sources of value disagreement and the mechanisms by which agreement can be generated in diverse populations (234–244).

Dmitri El Murr’s chapter “Kingly Intertwinement: 308b10–311c10” concludes the volume with an insightful discussion of the statesman’s goals in education and legislation, understanding the statesman’s activity as a kind of demiurgy (250). El Murr focuses especially on how unity can be generated among the citizens through rational consensus: “the heart of the demiurgic function of statesmanship . . . fits together the rational parts of individual citizens by bringing them to agree on common values” (253). For El Murr, our rationality is the condition that allows for the possibility of deep agreement, as reason provides us with a kind of divine kinship with each other (254), which can in turn be used by the statesman to “cement the community together” more effectively than coercive law (255).

In sum, this is a truly wonderful volume and I hope to have piqued the curiosity of potential readers so that they might also benefit from the depth of its insight and discussion.