Political Theory after Deleuze

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Nathan Widder, Political Theory after Deleuze, Continuum, 2012, 216pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441150882.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Nathan Widder's new book provides an introduction to those aspects of the thought of Deleuze that allow a connection with the field of political theory. It is difficult to define precisely the conceptual difference between political theory and political philosophy. Institutionally speaking, it's relatively easy to see that academic political theory practitioners are mostly trained in and employed by political science departments rather than in philosophy departments, where political philosophers congregate. But beyond that, as Jacob T. Levy notes in his interesting reflections , there are mostly only differences in tendency and emphasis rather than sharp divisions. Among those different tendencies are the composition of the canon; the attention paid to the history of political thought; the relative emphasis on "rigor" compared to "richness"; and, in a way that is certainly relevant to the present book, the relative openness to continental philosophy. For Levy, and this seems accurate to me, political theorists are for the most part more open to incorporating continental thinkers into their work, while continental philosophers writing on political matters tend not to worry whether their work would count as political theory or political philosophy.

With that as preamble, let's first note that Widder's book appears in the Deleuze Encounters series[1] put out by Continuum and edited by Ian Buchanan. The series, as stated on the Continuum, is aimed at students.[2]

The Deleuze Encounters series provides students in philosophy and related subjects with concise and accessible introductions to the application of Deleuze's work in key areas of study. Each book demonstrates how Deleuze's ideas and concepts can enhance present work in a particular field.

However, despite the series being aimed at students, there are elements of Widder's book from which specialists can profit. I will try in this review to point out both the elements from which teachers can expect that their students can benefit and those elements from which specialists can benefit -- as well as those occasions in which Widder, fully self-consciously no doubt, sacrifices specialist detail for the sake of a narrative unity to his work that serves students well.

The book has five chapters and a brief conclusion, each one of which I will comment on below: 1) a survey of the "ontological turn" in political theory; 2) an overview of "Deleuze's ontology"; 3) a treatment of Deleuze's work on Nietzsche; 4) a treatment of Deleuze and Guattari's notion of desire, mostly focusing on Anti-Oedipus; 5) the notion of "micropolitics," largely drawn from A Thousand Plateaus; and 6) a brief conclusion on the themes of pluralism and immanence.

Chapter 1 surveys those works in political theory that have unabashedly taken up issues of the ontology of human beings such as language, death, the unconscious, and the relation with others as they intersect with the constitution of the self. Widder nicely shows how these questions take up the communitarian critiques of the Rawlsian subject of A Theory of Justice-- critiques arguing that, contrary to Rawls's intention, his position requires large ontological commitments. As Widder presents the debate, the Rawlsian subject's supposed ability to choose is undercut by its bracketing the concrete heritage that makes the notions of "subject" and "choice" comprehensible in the first place. Widder then maps the consequent ontological turn in political theory along three axes, showing how Deleuze disrupts or at least renders more complex each of these oppositions: strong and weak ontology, abundance and lack, and immanence and transcendence.

Adopting Stephen White's terminology from Sustaining Affirmation: The Strengths of Weak Ontology in Political Theory (Princeton, 2000), Widder explains how strong versions establish ontological verities and derive political principles and programs from them, while weak versions establish ontological claims to which one can be deeply committed and yet remain self-consciously aware that they are contestable in virtue of an epistemological modesty vis-à-vis one's ability to discover real structures. Now Deleuze has a strong ontology -- he never hid his disdain for the notion of the "end of metaphysics" -- but what's he's after is the problematic structure of reality, a strong stance that nonetheless yields the self-questioning status of concrete commitments typical of "weak ontology." So Deleuze thinks he has discovered the way reality works (a reality that reaches far beyond human being): virtual differential structures (Ideas or multiplicities) are integrated or resolved or actualized or dramatized (the four are equivalent for Deleuze) in a way that preserves the problematic structure of the Idea -- there can be no final resolution of a problem. In fact, it's precisely the fact that resolutions feed back into problems in the process known as "counter-effectuation" (from actual back up to virtual) that guarantees an open future in which problems are continually posed anew. So what we get with Deleuze is a strong ontology that, by virtue of its having uncovered the structure of reality, grounds the experimental status of concrete commitments typical of "weak ontology." But for Deleuze, experimentation is not the result of epistemological modesty but of having discovered ontological truth.

With regard to the other axes, the way Deleuze relates the virtual, differential register to the actual, "differenciated" register susceptible to representation forecloses any commitment to self-present transcendent standards, thus making him a thinker of immanence, but one whose notion of "folds" renders illegitimate any simple inside/outside structure. Similarly, although Deleuze famously objects to theories of lack (one of the strengths of Widder's book, and something from which I think specialists can benefit, is its treatment of Lacan, which is sketched in Chapter 1 and dealt with in depth in Chapter 4); his notion of "abundance" cannot be harnessed to any sort of purely natural fullness.

Widder's Chapter 2, on "Deleuze's Ontology," is one that will benefit many students but must be approached by specialists with an awareness of the genre and aims of the book. That is to say, Widder very nicely produces a treatment of Deleuze that moves back-and-forth seamlessly between Logic of Sense and Difference and Repetition, a treatment that is then put to work in underpinning the readings of Anti-Oedipus and A Thousand Plateaus that come later in the book. But such a "continuity" reading, driving down to a core Deleuzean doctrine beneath a simple difference in vocabulary across Deleuze's single-authored work and the work with Guattari, is the subject of controversy in the specialist secondary literature, some of which looks to locate breaks and differences among the works.[3] However, we could say that the genre-compelled abstraction from specialist debate allows Widder's book to benefit students with a clean and concise treatment, which looks back to Deleuze's early review of Hyppolite's work on Hegel to isolate the notion of a Deleuzean "ontology of sense." Such an ontology of sense, looking to both sensation and significance, "constitutes and brings together domains that essentialist philosophies hold in opposition, such as the material and the conceptual" (23). First locating this notion in Deleuze's Logic of Sense, Widder then moves to Difference and Repetition; the five or six pages on Deleuze's treatment of difference in Aristotle, Hegel, and Leibniz being particularly clear and worth the attention of students and specialists alike.

In moving to Chapter 3, on Deleuze's Nietzsche, Widder notes that other commentators, friend and foe alike, have seen Bergson as Deleuze's main inspiration. Widder certainly acknowledges that the importance of Nietzsche to Deleuze has never been a secret, but Widder does make a good case that Hegel is the third figure here, insofar as underneath the surface anti-Hegelian polemics Deleuze's work on Nietzsche is actually "a subtle and sophisticated critique of and alternative to dialectics" (62). The key here, which helps present a narrative thread linking Chapters 2 and 3, is the "ontology of sense," which, as Widder shows, is cashed out in Deleuze's analysis of Nietzsche on interpretation and force. Another narrative continuity is provided by Widder's treatment of master and slave in Hegel and Nietzsche, with Deleuze's notion of active and reactive forces providing the framework. A third continuity is provided by the treatment of the eternal return, which in Chapter 2 culminates Widder's sketch of Deleuze's ontology, and here brings Chapter 3 to a close in a discussion of nihilism and the Overman. The key here is Widder's insistence that the fractured self produced by the experience of the eternal return (only that which differs returns, according to Deleuze) is not simply an ethical (or individualist and aristocratic challenge), but is also "micropolitical," a notion whose explication takes up the final two chapters of the book.

Chapter 4, "Desire and Desiring-Machines," treats Anti-Oedipus. This is the most fully realized section of Widder's book, providing both a fine overview from which students can benefit, and also a detailed treatment of Lacan and lack that specialists will find of interest. One particularly nice move on Widder's part is to recognize that while "Anti-Oedipus is an anti-Lacanian work, . . . it is most certainly not an anti-Lacan work" (104). Also of note is Widder's "continuist" move to connect Anti-Oedipus back to Difference and Repetition: "the unconscious, in short, is a realm of virtual differentiation rather than actualizing differenciation" (110). Once again, the gains in narrative unity for the student have to be weighed against the specialist's alertness to the continuity presupposition of this interpretation. (Let me be clear, on this second occasion of raising this point; I am not claiming that a continuity reading of Deleuze and Deleuze and Guattari is necessarily wrong, only that it comes at a price of overlooking specialist debates. But that price is well worth paying when it results in a coherent narrative that benefits students.)

Chapter 4 and 5 turn on the following point that Widder explains with exemplary clarity, bringing Difference and Repetition and Anti-Oedipus to bear on A Thousand Plateaus: the micropolitical realm of the constitution of desire works by way of molecular (differentiating) movement, while the macropolitical realm of constituted subjects and institutions works by way of molar (differenciated) stability. Using the Deleuze-Foucault relation on the issues of desire, subjectivity, and normalization as a leitmotif in these chapters, Widder rightly insists that this formulation does not imply that "the molecular is individual and the molar is collective" (111). Rather, insofar as the molecular is the realm of dynamic and local action, while the molar is the realm of statistical aggregates in which local variation is damped out, then "individuals are themselves molar . . . and molecular desire is diffused throughout social formations" (111). The crucial point is that "the molar social forms that emerge from desiring-production react back upon this molecular domain" (112). Hence the insistence by Deleuze and Guattari, which Widder tracks, that macropolitical struggle on the level of constituted identities is both indispensable and insufficient, requiring always attention to and (cautious) experimentation with micropolitical/molecular desire.

To move to a conclusion, and in full recognition of the limits of size and genre with which Widder dealt, here are two points of criticism. First, there is a noticeable lack of engagement with Marx, which, had it occurred, would have allowed notice of two fine books relevant to Widder's project, Jason Read's Micro-Politics of Capital (SUNY, 2003) and Nicholas Thoburn's Deleuze, Marx, and Politics (Routledge, 2003). Second, the brief case study of the organizational conflicts surrounding the 2004 European Social Forum that opens Chapter 5's analysis of micropolitics only leaves one wishing for more such concrete analysis.

Having said that, I think a more fitting conclusion is to say that I have been perhaps a little too scant in my acknowledgement of the achievement of Widder's book. I don't mean to suggest that this is only a student handbook (though it can be profitably so used); besides specific passages -- particularly its treatment of Hegel, Lacan, and Foucault -- from which specialists can benefit, the drive to construct a narrative that is both readable and appropriately detailed is praiseworthy and certainly enough to hold the specialist's attention throughout.

[1] Among the other titles in the Deleuze Encounters series are Philosophy After Deleuze, by Joe Hughes (whose specialist work Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation [Continuum, 2008] was reviewed in NDPR in 2010; Cinema after Deleuze, by Richard Ruston; and Theology after Deleuze, by Kristin Justaert.

[2] The Deleuze Encounters series thus differs from the Deleuze Connections series at Edinburgh University Press (also edited by Buchanan), in that the latter aims to produce work for specialists.

[3] Two important works pushing a transitional rather than continuity line would be Alberto Toscano, Theatre of Production (Palgrave Macmillan, 2006) and Alistair Welchman, "Deleuze's Post-Critical Metaphysics," Symposium: Canadian journal of Continental Philosophy (Fall 2009): pp. 25-54. Both see a more fully developed naturalism in A Thousand Plateaus, leaving behind the still rather Kantian concern with subjectivity -- albeit a fractured self and larval subject -- of Difference and Repetition.