Political Thought and History: Essays on Theory and Method

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J. G. A. Pocock, Political Thought and History: Essays on Theory and Method, Cambridge UP, 2009, 278pp., $26.99 (pbk), IBSN 9780521714068.

Reviewed by Michael L. Frazer, Harvard University



As J. G. A. Pocock is wholly aware, Thomas Kuhn’s paradigm of “paradigms” is of only limited usefulness outside the natural sciences. It can, however, help give us some sense of Pocock’s place in recent intellectual history. Just as political philosophers today cannot help but understand their work in terms of its relationship with that of John Rawls, historians of political thought cannot help but understand their work in terms of its relationship with the Cambridge School, of which Pocock was a founding member. Pocock was coauthor of a paradigm — or, as he would now put it, a “political language”, a new method for talking about political phenomena. The essays collected in the volume under review were selected by their author because they “indicate what I have taken (and still take) this method and its intimations to be” (vii).

The method developed by Pocock and his Cambridge colleagues now wields hegemony within its self-proclaimed domain, which includes all scholars of political thought who consider themselves historians, and pointedly excludes those who consider themselves philosophers. The Cambridge School placed a barrier between political theorists and their history. It is incumbent upon those living comfortably on their respective sides of the fence, as well as those who attempt to breach it, to understand why it was erected in the first place. As such, Political Thought and History is an indispensible volume for all of those working within and across these enclosed fields today.

The essays collected in this volume span most of Pocock’s career. Those in Part I — entitled “Political Thought as History” — are, by and large, older, the last dating from 1987. Although Part II — “History as Political Thought” — contains two essays from the 1960s, the other three are much more recent, as is an “intermezzo” on Quentin Skinner. For those new to Pocock’s take on the Cambridge method, these essays can serve as an accessible introduction. For those already familiar with Pocock’s work, the convenience of having many (if not all) of his major methodological writings together is considerable.

Political Thought and History is meant not only as an elucidation of the Cambridge method, but also as an application of it. At this late stage in his career, Pocock can look back at his place in the emergence of the Cambridge School in a distinctly Cantabrigian way. While others have already begun explaining the emergence of Cambridge contextualism as a product of its historical context,1 there is something strange and fascinating in watching a great scholar attempt this procedure on himself and his own ideas.

Pocock’s self-historicization necessitates that the introduction and several of the essays in this collection are, at least in part, autobiographical. Pocock recounts the birth of the Cambridge school as the offspring of Herbert Butterfield and Peter Laslett. The former supervised and the latter inspired Pocock’s 1952 doctoral dissertation, which eventually became his first book, The Ancient Constitution and the Feudal Law. Pocock theoretically defended the historical method applied in his work a decade later in the first of the seven chronologically-arranged essays on the topic in Part I.

Variations on this method were then further articulated later in the decade by Skinner and John Dunn. Skinner, too, has recently collected his methodological essays, in the first of three volumes entitled Visions of Politics. Unlike Skinner’s highly revised essays, Pocock’s have only been “lightly edited” (xvii); while these relatively minor changes to the bodies of the essays are not indicated, additions to the footnotes are clearly marked with square brackets. Far from making Pocock’s volume less valuable Skinner’s, this difference in editorial policy makes Political Thought and History an accurate record of the development of a body of thought over time in a way that Visions of Politics is not. Those who own Visions of Politics still rely on JSTOR for the original versions of such seminal essays as the 1969 bombshell “Meaning and Understanding in the History of Ideas”. Those who own Political Thought and History can save themselves from such characteristically Cantabrigian archival effort, and this is reason alone to purchase the book.

The relationship between Pocock’s methodological writings and those of Skinner and Dunn is a subtle one, but Pocock protests too much when he puts the “Cambridge method” in scare quotes. As Pocock freely admits, the Cambridge School is united by its insistence that historians interpret the history of political thought “as a multiplicity of language acts performed by language users in historical contexts” (viii). Although it is both possible and legitimate to read texts in other ways — as sources of philosophical arguments or of practical wisdom, for example — such readings are necessarily unhistorical, and must be clearly labeled as such. “The questions with which political philosophers come to deal may perhaps be perennial”, Pocock admits, “but precisely when they are, they cannot be historical” (52).

Skinner typically emphasizes the historical contextualization of individually important moves in given language games — that is, he engages in the interpretation what used to be called “great books”. Pocock’s work, by contrast, focuses on the languages in which these moves occur. The reader of Part I comes to understand how and why these languages were chosen as the primary protagonists in Pocock’s historical narratives, with individual people and texts confined to secondary, if still important, roles.

As should now be clear, Pocock’s “languages” are not familiar systems of “ethnically differentiated structures of human speech” such as Standard American English or Homeric Greek (88). As Pocock admits, they are much closer to Kuhnian paradigms like Ptolemaic astronomy or Galenic medicine. For purposes of clarity, Pocock considered calling them “sub-languages”, “vocabularies”, “rhetorics” or “idioms” — and for a time borrowed Kuhn’s term “paradigms” — but he ultimately settled on “languages” as the simplest label.

It is a fascinating question to what extent languages in the ordinary sense limit what it is possible for us to think. Kuhnian paradigms, until shattered by revolution, place very strict limits indeed. Too strict, in Pocock’s view — his languages are looser, offering ample resources for articulating internal disagreements. They are not crystalline structures prone to shattering, but organic forms capable of adaptation, fission and fusion. Rarely destroyed in great revolutions, they instead fade slowly into memory. When they do, it is the historian’s job to preserve them. “Much of the historian’s time”, Pocock writes, “is spent in … learning these languages, so that ‘he’ can recognize when it appears on the page before ‘him’ and can follow, and sometimes predict, where it will lead” (77).2

Examples of political languages from Pocock’s own work on early modern Britain include scholasticism, classical republicanism, and commonwealth radicalism, as well as natural, canon, civil and common law. These languages do not define hermetic, monolingual communities. To the contrary, there are usually many overlapping languages present in any given time and place. “Each of us speaks with many voices”, Pocock writes, “like a tribal shaman in whom the ancestor ghosts are all talking at once” (37).

“Some great innovators, like Plato or Marx, create and diffuse new languages in their success in becoming authorities”, Pocock admits; “others, like Machiavelli or Hobbes, through their success in becoming adversaries, to rebut whom new languages come into being”. Pocock himself could be included in this list of innovators; Cambridge historiography, if not quite on a par with Platonism or Marxism, surely qualifies as a “language” in Pocock’s sense.

Part II is then the autobiography, not of an individual developing and applying a new concept of political languages, but that of a profession as a whole — the profession of the modern academic historian. The political history of historiography that Pocock gives here traces the emergence of this unique activity, and its subsequent effects on the polities in which it is embedded. As a result of its political effects, Pocock considers historiography to be a form of political thought, one which has been considerably underappreciated as such by comparison with political philosophy.

If Pocock were a Whig historian in the manner that Butterfield opposed so adamantly — or, even worse, a Hegelian philosopher of history — the narrative of intellectual progress in Part II might be taken to justify the methodology described in Part I as its inevitable culmination. Like Weber’s politicians and scientists, however, Pocock’s historians cannot justify their vocation — they can only explain it. Insofar as the language of modern historiography intersects with the language of normative justification at all, it does so in a wholly negative way — debunking the pseudo-historical myths which traditions tell to legitimate their authority. “The criticism of tradition”, Pocock claims, “is history” (205).

No tradition, in Pocock’s view, was in greater need of debunking than that of old-fashioned political theory, the grand narrative from Plato’s philosopher-kings to Marx’s proletarian-dictators articulated by George Sabine and others a generation before Pocock. Reading Sabine as a young man, Pocock was enthralled, soon realizing that “this was the tradition which it was to be my business to criticize” (22).

Yet if gaining wisdom from great books is fundamentally unhistorical, perhaps the proper response is to conclude, “Well, so much the worse for history”. Cantabrigian historiography, after all, is just one of many languages that human beings have used to talk about politics, no more or less privileged than Latin scholasticism or English common law — or Sabinian political theory, for that matter. It is, moreover, a language designed by its creators to be incapable of offering practical guidance, guidance which was once provided by the traditions which modern historiography has helped to undermine. While Pocock’s mode of scholarship is rife with intellectual excitement — the interpreter of Pocockian languages, like her academic rival the Straussian esotericist, is a kind of “code-breaker” (32) — it serves no constructive social purpose. “Professional historians”, Pocock writes, “rank among that irritating class of beings who may follow the logic of their discourse even at the cost of their loyalties to society” (269).

A supremely gifted and reflective historian, Pocock describes his own activity with the same insight with which he describes that of others, and he can trace its emergence over time as surely as he traces theirs. Pocock deserves great credit for having the consistency and humility to view himself as just another political thinker in just another historical context, playing the same games with the same limited set of inherited concepts and categories. While this accurate self-description may satisfy historians, philosophers seeking normative justifications may wonder whether Pocock’s has been a language game worth playing at all. It is possible, however, that this suspicion is just a product of what Pocock calls the “first law of interdisciplinary communication … Nearly all methodological debate is useless, because nearly all methodological debate is reducible to the formula: You should not be doing your job; you should be doing mine” (51).

Historians and philosophers have never been sure quite what to make of each other. Socrates and Thucydides were contemporaries, and yet there is no record of their intellectual interaction. “It would be possible”, Pocock concludes, “to fancy that they wisely kept out of each other’s way” (124). Yet even disciples of Socrates who would never dream of apprenticing themselves to Thucydides can learn much from what John Pocock has achieved in his chosen vocation.

1 See, for example, Emile Perreau-Saussine, “Quentin Skinner in Context”, The Review of Politics 69:1 (February 2007), pp. 106-122.

2 Lest the scare quotes around “he” and “him” be misconstrued, it must be noted that Pocock admirably struggles with how to construct a genderless terminology for the abstract individual, and adopts a number of different solutions in different essays in the volume, none of them wholly satisfactory.