Politics and Negation: For an Affirmative Philosophy

Politics And Negation

Roberto Esposito, Politics and Negation: For an Affirmative Philosophy, Zakiya Hanafi (tr.), Polity, 2019, 237pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781509536627.

Reviewed by Gregory Fried, Boston College


Who would have dared contradict Johnny Mercer, who sang that

You've got to accentuate the positive
Eliminate the negative
Latch on to the affirmative
Don't mess with Mr. In-Between
No, don't mess with Mr. In-Between

Well, Roberto Esposito has dared to contradict this seemingly prudent advice. In the book, translated fluently from the Italian by Zakiya Hanafi, Esposito argues that the "mess" that the western tradition now finds itself in, both philosophically and politically, is one brought on by a mistaken relation to the negative, most especially by the conception that, in Mercer's words, "You've got to . . . eliminate the negative." Esposito contends that we must learn "the ways of understanding and practicing the 'affirmativity' of the negative" in order to "break the connection between negative and politics in which the metaphysical pulse of western politics continues to beat" (9). The story of how the western tradition has delivered us into this mess, as well as how that tradition might nevertheless provide us ways to deliver ourselves from it, serves as the substance of the book.

For Esposito, the will to negate negation stands at the root of global modernity's crisis of nihilism, because western metaphysics has itself gone global in modernity, risking a "global civil war" (5). In the Introduction, he writes, "Nihilism is not the negation of being -- as one often keeps hearing -- but the destruction of the difference that inhabits being" (3). Here, Esposito demonstrates his decisive debt to Martin Heidegger, for whom the nothing is not the opposite or negation of being, as it might be in a Platonist metaphysics, but rather the inherent counterpart to being, because being, as a temporal unfolding of meaning as such, is always bound up in the interplay between presence and absence, meaning and unmeaning. In this review, I will follow the book's practice of rendering this Heideggerian conception of Sein as lower-case 'being' -- with Heidegger's understanding, which Esposito clearly adopts, that being is not a being, a thing among other things, not even the big-B Supreme Being, but rather the condition for the possibility that any given being can mean anything to us as what we take it to be.

This understanding of "the difference that inhabits being" is decisive as much for Esposito as it is for Heidegger. If being is not a being but rather the event or the unfolding historical domain within which beings are meaningful to us and also fall into unmeaning for us, then negation and negativity (the Nothing) is intimately bound up with being human. That sharing of a world in this difference is the core to politics for Esposito. But because the expanding nihilism of western metaphysics has worked to obliterate this difference between meaning and unmeaning, the positive and the negative, that "inhabits being," according to Esposito, the "principal contribution" of this nihilism, "has not been the production of the negative but the negation of the negative -- and therefore its doubling" (3). His point is that western thought has increasingly treated the negative as something to be eradicated, but because the negative is inherent to being -- the "positive" in the sense of a hermeneutically meaningful world for habitation of historical human beings -- this tendency has contributed to the "doubling" of negation. Hence: "By negating the negative that has always permeated our experience, what we call nihilism ended up strengthening it exponentially, consigning us to its destructive reproduction" (3).

For Esposito, this exponentially destructive nihilism has, in modernity, a decisive political profile, but not one characterized by any ordinary political ideology. Instead, the double nihilism that reproduces itself in politics is potentially all-encompassing, across the political spectrum. Esposito defines this as totalitarianism on a metapolitical scale, as "the attempt to eliminate negation by characterizing as universal a political, social, or racial type of particularity" (4). By totalizing a particularist marker of self-affirming identity -- be it "political, social, or racial" -- as the universal standard for a positive affirmation of community and justice, a specific historical movement must inevitably "eliminate" and thereby negate anything, and therefore potentially, and often actually, anyone or group of people that itself threatens the totalizing claims of this particularist self-affirmation.

Identity functions on the basis of both a positive moment (the positing of a determinant for inclusion) and a negative one (the determinant for exclusion), but Esposito's point is that modern redoubled nihilism requires not just these two moments. It also requires the negation of what has been excluded, a double negation, in order to carry out the totalization of its self-affirmation. The "not" of exclusion demands not only differentiation but also the "not" of annihilating what has been excluded as the price of the totalization of self-affirmation. In Johnny Mercer's words, if you want to "Latch on to the affirmative," then "You've got to accentuate the positive," but you've also "got to" go a step further and "Eliminate the negative." And not only that, you have to go to a triple negative: "No, don't mess with Mr. In-Between." But who, or more probably what, is this Mr. In-Between between affirmation and negation? And what does it mean to "mess" with him?

One can understand the main body of this book as Esposito's analysis of the grounds on which we might answer this question. The book is divided into three parts, two of five chapters, the last of three. Although they do not follow a strictly historical sequence, most of the chapters focus on specific figures in the history of philosophy from the early modern to the near-contemporary. While scholars may certainly challenge Esposito's readings of specific figures, his analyses raise deep questions for those who share his sense that we are indeed passing through an age of crisis. One of the pleasures in store for readers is how Esposito points out unexpected filiations among authors as diverse as Hobbes, Heidegger, and Freud on the meaning of negation in the cumulative nihilism of modern thought.

The reader might be surprised that Esposito does not devote a chapter to Hegel, given the importance of the negative in his logic, phenomenology, and philosophy of history. Esposito does indeed weave discussion of Hegel throughout the book, but he charges Hegel with adumbrating a problem we have yet to resolve. For Esposito, Hegel's "negation has a literally constitutive role" for human consciousness and sociality. It is the apriori to "Language, knowledge, action" because it alone enables "distinguishing, determining, and separating." In Esposito's striking phrasing, in Hegel "the negative is the wound, but also the soul, of the real" (3). Hence, negation has an affirmative character for Hegel, but according to Esposito, that affirmation retains a poison pill, because ultimately Hegel's "affirmation arises from the negation of negation." So, Esposito asks, "Is the negation thus affirmed or negated?" (3-4). This is the plight of nihilism's totalizing double negation.

This is why, in his fifth and final chapter of Part I, Esposito presents Kojève, the masterful expositor of Hegel's philosophy of history, "as the most extreme thinker of western nihilism" (67). Kojève had recognized that the aspirations to a universal empire in "the Napoleonic dream," globalized by "the American victory at the end of the European Civil War would have given life to a universal and homogenous state, in which each individual is recognized by the 'other' without having to challenge the opponent in the struggle of recognition" (66). This lure of a final solution to the ethico-political problem depends upon affirmation as the elimination of differentiation, where otherness becomes merely formal, not substantive. Hence, for Esposito, "What Kojève presents as reality [the present actuality of the end of history] is Schmitt's worst nightmare" (66). This is why Esposito's first chapter is on Carl Schmitt, for whom such political "struggle" is the very nature of human sociality as the properly polemical political recognition for relation of identity to self and difference from other in the friend/enemy distinction.

This is also why Esposito, in the three intervening chapters, takes up Saussure, Freud, and Heidegger. Esposito discerns that "Heidegger's vocabulary takes on a markedly polemological cast" (48), especially metapolitically, after he fixed upon the negational aspect of truth as alētheia, un-concealment. Heidegger did indeed seize upon Heraclitus's Πόλεμος during his involvement with National Socialism (54).[1] In Saussure, it is the negative that defines the positive of meaning through the opposition of linguistic difference of phonemes that becomes "a powerful nihilation machine" (31), because every idea, every meaning, "is the 'not' of it 'not'" (32), a "this" whose essence is defined by the negational opposition to some other that (36). But the essence of every singular thing, as singular, is itself negated by language turning what "this" is into an abstraction by naming it to a category as a word. Politically, "the negational power of language" in composing the unity of one community risks allowing "a 'not' to be placed before the word 'human,'" and so then even an inclusionary politics must mobilize the double negative against this exclusion (35-36). Freud gives psychological precision to this political pathology of human nature by realizing that it is "the pleasure principle that operates under the direction of the death drive" and "life is nothing more than a brief interval between a double non-existence" (45-46).

In Heidegger, the metapolitical implications of this death-drive and Schmitt's friend/enemy opposition metastasize as ontologized polemology. In his reading of Heidegger's lectures and the Black Notebooks of the Nazi period, Esposito rightly recognizes that the being of a people is defined in the struggle against another people that the first is not; hence, struggle's "first adversary . . . is non-struggle" (54). This why in a 1933 lecture, Heidegger says that "it is a fundamental requirement to find the enemy, to expose the enemy to the light, or even first to make the enemy, so that this standing against the enemy may happen and so that Dasein [as the historically situated existence of a people] may not lose its edge."[2] Esposito once again is right when he argues that in Heidegger's apocalyptic history of being as a history of nihilism escalating ever since Plato, Heidegger's own people, the Germans, play the role of tragic hero, and their arch-enemy are the Jews (55-56). The nothing that Heidegger had identified as the ground of being in Being and Time has arisen to reclaim that ground in the crisis of modernity by threatening to replace polemological differentiation with a universal homogenization at the end of history as carried forward by entities that seek to impose their particularism masquerading as universalism: Americanism, Bolshevism, and most insidiously, Judaism.

This apogee of horror in Heidegger illuminates a major theme in Esposito's book, the autoimmune disease that characterizes the West's nihilism now unleashed globally. It identifies the totalizing trajectory of the West's ambition to negate everything that stands in the way of its own positive universalization as generating the West's impulse to negate negation itself. But the negative, as a feature of being itself, cannot be extirpated and only returns with a vengeance. Examples include the creation of devastating nuclear weapons in the death-logic of mutually assured destruction, as well as support for mujahedin fighters in Afghanistan to counter the Soviet enemy, only to find that those very fighters had mutated into al-Qaeda.

The next five chapters, Part II of the book, endeavor to map out the etiology of this autoimmune disorder in, broadly speaking, the founding thinkers and ideas of classical liberalism in early modernity. In contrast to Aristotle, who depoliticized (negated) one class of humanity, slaves, to give positive freedom in political life to another, the citizens of the polis, Hobbes depoliticized humanity entirely: both before the social contract, in the state of nature as a state of war, and after the social contract as the absolute rule of the Leviathan (80). With his elimination of formal and final cause, and hence of teleology in human life, the resultant dominion of material and efficient cause leaves no room for freedom. Hobbes's metapolitics depends on the annihilation of nature to mimic, in the creation of the artificial Leviathan, God's creation ex nihilo (85). This negational freedom is subsumed by a machine of efficient and material causes. As the enemy precedes the friend, but must be negated, as nature precedes civil society, but must be negated, so must the metaphysics of teleological freedom be negated by the modern material science of politics. Sovereignty itself becomes negation, either in the sword of the monarch, or in Rousseau's general will of the people, which must ever negate the private will of the individual as a private, internal enemy (96). Modern private property emerges from the negation of the medieval commons as the exclusion of the rights of some from what used to be a positive sense of community property, just as we find in Locke's justification of the negation of the original community of goods in the state of nature to the enclosure of private lands (102-104). In Locke, "the absoluteness of property is not so much the cause as it is the effect of its non-belonging to others" and this results in the dispossessed becoming alienated from the only thing they have left to sell, their labor, causing "a universal dispossession" (105). In the resultant capitalist system of production, each human subject is eventually "sucked into the void of an object, reduced to being an exchange commodity and then a pure numeric index" (107).

In Part III, Esposito works his way towards an alternative to the double-bind of the negation of negation at work in modernity. He finds in Deleuze's concept of difference a first clue to an affirmative mode of negation that might wriggle free of nihilism's double negative. In a reversal of Hobbes, for Deleuze (and Guatari) the friend precedes the enemy; rather than the impulsion to negate the enemy as threat to one's own being, the friend is the positive basis for a metapolitical ethic. With this philo-politics, "They replace the primacy of negation with an affirmation that has the capacity to include even its own opposite" (138), because difference no longer impels annihilation but rather an open welcome to the other, allowing existing institutions and norms to be changed by this encounter. This sidesteps the negation of negation by permitting to become positive the encounter with what threatens to negate.

Mr. In-Between begins to take shape for Esposito in the form of Deleuze, a thinker who neither exclusively accentuates the positive nor longs to eliminate the negative but rather affirms the positivity of negativity. "Both the idea that being is a positive reality without tensions and the idea that being is positive from non-being are equally wrong" (145). Unlike Heidegger or Derrida, Deleuze affirms rather than recoils from a "remainder" of the metaphysical tradition (139), because that very remainder, as an irritant, becomes a positive impulsion both to ongoing thought, rather than the end of dialectical thought in a final wisdom as for Hegel, and a reconstruction of institutions as an affirmative response to the negativity of finitude.

The second instance of affirmative negation that Esposito identifies is determination. He focuses on Spinoza's "direct link between determination and negation" (156). Against Hegel, Spinoza's determinatio is not pure negatio. "To determine means to limit something through another thing, which, by not coinciding with the first, necessarily negates its absoluteness" (168). To be finite and delimited through determination does not negate the particular being in its singularity, it enables it -- but it also sets a limit on its ambition, as it were, to totalize itself as the determination of everything. "Accordingly, negation and affirmation are melded together like the two specular sides of the same determination" (170). If this determinate being is freely accepted, it opens up the potential of a new metapolitics, because it can counteract the negative necessity of a Hobbesian world defined only by material and efficient causes that induce a twin pathology: a negational stance towards nature and others as bearers of threat united with a will to a totalizing political dominion as the only outlet for of positivity.

The third and final affirmative negation that Esposito delineates is opposition. This term may first sound militantly negative, and this fits with Schmitt's political identification of opposition and enmity, the polemos that Heraclitus named as the affirmative father of all things (177). Esposito's countermove is to argue that rather than the negational elimination of opposition as the core of politics, politics instead requires the internalization and integration of opposition as a necessary feature of the biopolitics of a community, but not by simply subsuming it. Conflict is not the opposite of politics but rather the essence of politics, not for the sake of annihilating the opponent, but for the sake of ever-again renegotiating the differences that necessarily disrupt the political order due to the determination of these differing constituencies of the body politic "in a dialectic that alternates struggle with agreement" (179). Rather than a logical contradiction to be eliminated, the negative of opposition is a positive, an affirmative, that enables political life as a clash whose purpose is precisely not the annihilation of the opponent, who was and will be again -- a friend. For Esposito, Nietzsche had also understood that the negative is affirmative and in this sense "a constitutive power of the human being" (191).

This then is the clue to an alternative to the autoimmune disease of the double negative of nihilism. Esposito suggests that as an element injected into the body politic, the negative is not merely a cure:

In this case, what is being inoculated is not a lesser negative meant to obstruct a greater negative, as in normal vaccination [so, like getting small dose of small pox to develop the antibodies to fend off the full-blown disease], but the positively fragile, dangerous, risky character of existence itself. (190)

The positivity of negativity is truly positive, because it does not eliminate the negative but makes it properly function as the integral driving force of the community's biopolitics that is necessarily dangerous (because political conflict can break out in the genuinely logical opposite of politics, war), but also necessary to reintregrating the existence of the body politic. So, community is not coextensive with immunity, otherwise community would be impermeable, a totality, free from irritants and annihilating external threats. But no finite community can exist without the tumults of opposition, and so these must be part of the living constitution of community.

So, Esposito's Mr. In-Between, a step up -- or perhaps more prudently, back -- from Nietzsche's overman, turns out to be this trifecta of difference-determination-opposition by which the negative is affirmed as constitutive of politics, rather than the arch-enemy to be eliminated totally. This trifecta works because political community's perfection is imperfection: in its difference from others, a community is determinate, and this delimitation is necessarily finite, not a totality that can master necessity, and so opposition, whether internal or external, is not a negation to be relentlessly negated. Rather, if properly functioning, this trifecta is like the immune system that "serves not as a dividing wall" of a community's determinate differentiation to what is other to it "but as a diaphragm and filter in our communication with the external environment" (199) without which the body politic could not live in a nature that it had not totally mastered by annihilating all opposition.

The injection of opposition that I would want to make to the body of Esposito's erudite and synoptic argument is that the implications for what this Mr. In-Between means for politics, our politics, as we live it locally, nationally, and internationally, are rather vague. Esposito might reply that this is the necessary effect of a treatise on metapolitics, but for a thinker who insists upon the singularity of things and existence, that would seem a dodge. Esposito is obviously highly critical of Heidegger's Nazism, and he seems equally critical of an imperial, totalizing socialism on the Soviet model; he is also critical of the classical liberal tradition and what must seem to him as its atomizing trajectory in an inevitable "break-up of American people into opposing ethnicities incapable of generating the seed of a future people" (153). Trumpian politics and the attack on the US Capitol on January 6, 2021 give that charge some bite, but he also criticizes contemporary communitarianism and multiculturalism as "not only reductive but even destructive vis-à-vis the universalist vocation of communitas" (198), presumably because each of these has far too crude a conception of the affirmative-negative biopolitics of a healthy polity's immune system. While Esposito seems to aim here at that "universalist vocation of communitas," this too is puzzling, because would not the universalizing of community partake in the logic of totalizing affirmation through the annihilation of difference? If Esposito opposes Derrida's totalizing conception of deconstruction as the eternal demolition of the metaphysical remnant (139), what polities and what institutions would his affirmative negation eliminate, reconstruct, or retain, and how? In sum, he gives very little indication, at least in this volume, what an alternative might be to the forms of political life we have known hitherto. I think there is one that would more amply confront and reconstruct the affirmative-negative of the tradition, but that is a tale for another day in getting to know Mr. In-Between.


[1] See G. Fried, Heidegger's Polemos: From Being to Politics (New Haven, Yale University Press, 2000).

[2] See M. Heidegger, Being and Truth, trans. G. Fried and R. Polt (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2010), 73.