Politics and the Order of Love: An Augustinian Ethic of Democratic Citizenship

Placeholder book cover

Eric Gregory, Politics and the Order of Love: An Augustinian Ethic of Democratic Citizenship, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 417pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226307510.

Reviewed by John von Heyking, University of Lethbridge


Eric Gregory has written a theologically and philosophically compelling defense of Augustine's account of love and its importance for politics, and civic liberalism in particular. He succeeds in defending Augustine against the charge that his account of ordinate loving (ordo amoris) is too otherworldly, which results in an excessive love of God that eclipses loving one's neighbor and produces a paternalistic politics. While Gregory brings Augustine into conversation with significant liberal, including feminist, thinkers and demonstrates how Augustine's thought harmonizes with and sometimes lends a hand to contemporary debates, his primary concern is to show Christians, and Augustinian liberals in particular, that liberal democracy, improved at least by some Augustinian insights, should be appealing to them. Liberals seem necessarily to need Augustine to help them practice liberal virtues, but Augustinian liberals need some help to see how liberal virtues coincide with Augustinian ones. Gregory states: "Theorizing virtues for citizens in a liberal society does not necessarily require this [Augustinian] teleological structure. But, for Christians, something like this teleological structure is both warranted and compatible with liberal self-understandings" (332). His book defends Augustine's "subordinationist" teleological structure (defined, p. 332) against critics, especially Hannah Arendt, who think it reduces human beings to mere occasions of love and thus produces a paternalistic politics.

The first four chapters of the book constitute a clearing of the underbrush of various conceptual misunderstandings, with Chapters Five and Six serving as the substance of Gregory's account of Augustinian ordo amoris. Chapter One, titled "Beyond Public Reason," justifies the inclusion of love in political debates. Liberal, and largely Rawlsian, arguments over justice -- defined mostly as procedural -- are overly abstract and neglect the affective dimension of politics. Moreover, they distort justice, which requires motivational force and attention to the other. Gregory's argument here, which gets elaborated throughout the book as he develops Augustine's Christology, is to cultivate virtues that enable us to perceive and embrace other citizens in the concrete. Love helps justice by enabling us to see the person to whom we owe her due.

Chapter Two outlines variations of Augustinian liberalism in the twentieth century. Gregory identifies three types: 1) the realist school (including Reinhold Niebuhr and Robert Markus) which emphasizes sin; 2) procedural or Rawlsian liberalism (including Paul Weithman and Edmund Santurri) which identifies minimal legal proceduralism with Augustinian limited politics; and 3) civic liberalism (including Jean Bethke Elshtain, Oliver O'Donovan, and Rowan Williams, the current Archbishop of Canterbury), which emphasizes love as the central political virtue. Gregory presents his own Augustinian liberalism as an enhanced version of the third.

Chapter Three considers the focus on care in feminist political theory as a way of elaborating the argument of Chapter One and also to defuse feminist critics of Augustine who dismiss him as patriarchal. Gregory argues his concerns are largely their concerns, and so feminists and Augustinian liberals can make common cause against Rawlsian liberals and their fetish for procedural justice and Pelagian notions of autonomy. Chapter Four provides a rebuttal of Hannah Arendt's criticism of Augustine's account of love. Arendt provides the most philosophically compelling argument that Augustine is too otherworldly and thus diminishes the importance of neighbor. Gregory demonstrates how her own Kantian-inspired sense of decorum led her to dismiss love as relevant for public affairs and also influenced her reading of Augustine.

The first four chapters prepare the ground for Gregory's positive rendering of Augustinian ordo amoris in Chapters Five and Six. Chapter Five considers love as a political virtue suited for liberalism, while Chapter Six demonstrates Augustine's account of love of neighbor as sufficiently this-worldly to bear the weight of love as a civic virtue.

Chapter Five provides a convincing account of the central role of love in Augustine's ethics, and the way it unifies the virtues. Gregory demonstrates how Augustine balances the motivational aspect of love with the results it has on the actions of human beings exercising practical judgment. Critics of Augustinian ethics tend to view him either simply as a subjectivist ("love and do what you will" means that only motivation matters, regardless of what evil act is performed) or as offering a consequentialist ethic (for which we cannot help but to commit sinful actions in pursuit of some good). Gregory demonstrates once and for all the fallacy of this false dichotomy, and shows how Augustine's theory of ordo amoris involves a supple account of inwardness and outward action.

While Gregory endeavors to show how Augustine makes virtue available to all and thus "democratizes" it against the inegalitarian virtue theories of the ancient philosophers (e.g., Plato), he does admit that, for Augustine, ordo amoris depends on the cultivation of the virtues to the extent that Gregory is willing to view "Aristotelian" elements in Augustine's observation that "the person who lives a just and holy life is one who is a sound judge of these things" (262, quoting De Doctrina Christiana, 1.27). I highlight this passage to counterbalance Gregory's tendency to exaggerate Augustine's claims for equality. While Augustine's Christology makes virtue available to all, not everyone takes up the invitation. This issue of response is related to, but is not identical with, Gregory's concluding remarks on Augustine's account of reprobation, which seems to damn the majority of human beings, and appears to introduce an inegalitarian streak into Augustine's civic liberalism (382).

Moreover, just as not everyone takes up the invitation to live a "just and holy life," not everyone takes up the invitation to cultivate one's political prudence. While love is central, it is guided by prudence (297). Gregory's focus on the ethics of citizenship and his pronounced lack of interest in the questions of statesmanship (e.g., the nature of political authority, [56]) seem to have led him to exaggerate Augustine's commitment to equality (which nevertheless is real, and constitutes his innovation past ancient virtue theories). More misleading, Gregory refers to Augustine's innovation as "democratizing," as if a particular regime provides the best category for describing the full amplitude of Augustine's theological and philosophical innovations (e.g., 353, 355).[1]

These reservations concerning Gregory's categories of citizenship in Augustine's virtue theory lead to greater reservations concerning his account of coercion in Augustine. Augustinian liberals have excised this aspect of Augustine because they are liberals, not Augustinians (299). As liberals, they have not given in, like Augustine did, to the temptation of using love -- usually used to affirm the dignity and otherness of one's neighbor -- in a paternalistic fashion that violently projects one's own desires onto another. This is an overly rosy reading of liberalism. Consider J. S. Mill's progressivist defense of liberty, for which liberty best serves those intellects best equipped with "originality." Yet, the unoriginal cannot fully appreciate originality, so they can benefit from the service the original provide them of "opening their eyes."[2] Contrast Mill's sophistic approach to education with that of Augustine (and Plato), for whom humans can have no agency in opening the eyes of another. In Mill's day, original minds worked for the East India Company in support of England's policy of paternalistic imperialism. Today's original minds, the technocrats graduating from Ivy League universities (and not the University of Idaho), fill bureaucratic positions, either at the Department of State to create a secular democracy in Iraq, or at the Department of the Treasury to provide trillions of dollars of "stimulus" on the assumption they know better than the "unoriginal" millions of American entrepreneurs -- the market -- who do not know what is good for them.

One may protest that Augustine's defense of coercion differs in kind from American progressivism. However, both appear to share the paternalistic impulse of projecting "elite" views onto others using the coercive powers of the state. Moreover, Gregory, like just about every other Augustinian liberal except for John Bowlin whom Gregory cites approvingly, neglects what Augustine actually advocated as the form of coercion. Gregory and other Augustinian liberals, because they are liberals, are the mirror image of the Roman patricians to whom Augustine felt he needed to justify coercion (Bowlin helpfully explains the significance of the fact of Augustine's justification before defending the contents of Augustine's justification). Romans reflected their culture in simply assuming coercion is a natural part of politics; Augustinian liberals reflect liberal culture in simply assuming coercion cannot be a natural part of politics, though coercion always has a way of sneaking back into liberal politics, a fact liberals prefer not to justify. In justifying coercion, Augustine felt compelled also to justify the nature of the political authority tasked with exercising coercion.

Gregory's avowed refusal to enter into questions of statesmanship, which Augustine did in the letters justifying coercion (and also restraining the practices of Roman authorities), prevents him from following Augustine's radical questioning. Moreover, a sign of his refusal to enter into these questions is his failure to consider the relationship between means and ends of coercive methods. He raises this question in his reference to Bowlin's analysis, and in a side-step move applying Augustine's understanding of ius in bello to coercion. However, he neglects what Augustine actually exhorted Roman authorities to do in their coercion of heretics. He need not have side-stepped in considering ius in bello because the rules of proportionality Augustine develops there are similar to his justification of coercion.

While the Romans were busy executing heretics or stretching and scorching them on the rack, the worst coercive measure Augustine exhorted them to exercise (in order to restrain them) was to beat Donatist bishops with wooden rods. He advocated beating bishops because followers were largely victims of charismatic and violent bishops who kept followers insulated and misled them about Catholic doctrines. He advocated wooden rods, instead of the metal ones the Romans were using, because those were the tools schoolmasters used to beat children (as Augustine explains in the Confessions of his own experience as a schoolboy). Even so, Augustine mostly advocated fines and exile for bishops. He deemed coercion necessary because the exclusionist and Puritanical principles of the Donatists were themselves violent. His justification was based on an analysis of ends and means and proportionality. He did not think coercion would guarantee conversion. Rather, coercion, while intended to be educative, is the imperfect response statesmen have to violent disorder.[3] Liberals face the same problem when confronted by radical ideological and religious groups whose principles repudiate liberal commitments to tolerance, liberty, and equality. If the liberal norm is to expel, incarcerate, attack, place illiberal religious groups under surveillance, take away their children under the guise of "compassion," or otherwise marginalize them as irrational, then Augustine's appeals to proportionality in determining the form of coercion would surely earn him the wrath of contemporary liberals, Augustinian and otherwise, as being "soft on crime."

Chapter Six demonstrates how love of God (or "otherworldliness") does not eclipse love of neighbor. If anything, Augustine was concerned about the obstacles to loving one's neighbor. Gregory does a splendid job marshalling evidence to illustrate the transformational power of love in enabling us to embrace our neighbor. In doing so, he demonstrates how love retains and respects political justice, and how Augustine provides a constructive role for particular loves. Love of neighbor, instead of being dissipated in a universal benevolence that ignores the neighbor immediately in front of us, can only be practiced in particular relations. Particular relations, friendship in particular, constitute the vehicle for our love of neighbor; they are not an inferior (though currently more practical) form of love than universal love.

If I have a criticism of this chapter, it is in Gregory's tendency to use language that undercuts his message of love's transformative power. Put more philosophically, he realizes, with Augustine, that love of God and neighbor cannot be treated as propositions. Gregory admits, as Augustine does, that the nature of love of God and of neighbor cannot be "proven." Instead, one must treat these terms as indices of experiences. While Gregory skillfully dissects Augustine's frequent discussions of love as use and enjoyment, and their respective orderings, he treats them as axioms or propositions that need to be proven. This is seen in his tendency to speak misleadingly of "strategies" of love (e.g., p. 380), which is the language of technique, not of love.

But love is not a strategy and Gregory knows it (e.g., p. 349). His best insights about love are in his metaphors or analogies, as when he cites Helmut Baer's comparison of Augustine's meditations on love as a "free flowing rhapsody of modern jazz" and Augustine's own description of the expression of love of God and of neighbor in the Decalogue as a multi-stringed instrument (340-1). Improvisations (though ordered by prudence, taste, and experience, as any jazz musician can tell you) and symphonics better explain love than syllogism.

Gregory's appeal to the tradition of Augustinian liberalism requires comment. Any appeal to tradition needs to explain whom one identifies as part of that tradition. For the most part, Augustinian liberals appear to be academics who explicitly draw upon Augustine's categories to analyze political order. Belonging to the tradition is a bit like belonging to the guild. Yet, Gregory also includes others like Gustavo Gutierrez and Martin Luther King, Jr. who make less frequent and less explicit use of Augustine. One wishes his standard for inclusion were more explicit. For instance, can one be an Augustinian liberal if one's central category is, like Gregory, Augustine's "restless heart" but makes that only implicit?

David Walsh, author of The Growth of the Liberal Soul, is one such example. Yet, Gregory utterly misunderstands Walsh's project when he dismisses, as a "surreal" Christian criticism, Walsh's comment, which is preliminary, that the liberal political tradition has become the dominant political form (102n.48). Walsh does not identify the sheer prominence of the liberal political form as a way of justifying it, other than to note that its prominence is an invitation to examine its deeper moral wellsprings. The rest of Walsh's book shows, in broad Augustinian terms, how the restless heart cannot rest, not only in any single earthly institution (as Gregory argues) but also in any particular theoretical formulation, including "liberalism." As noted above, Gregory recognizes love cannot be reduced to propositional logic, and it is unfortunate he fails to recognize a fellow-traveler who can offer deep insights into the role of love in the liberal order.

One also wishes Gregory would have engaged other Augustinian political thinkers (broadly conceived) like Michael Oakeshott and Eric Voegelin. While they, like Arendt, cannot be described simply as "liberal," their appeal to Augustinian categories provide direct routes for Augustinian liberals into the depths of political analysis that provide greater insights than those of many Augustinian liberals. Finally, one wonders why Gregory does not refer to Gerhart Niemeyer who was Niebuhr's contemporary as a public intellectual in theorizing about politics and international affairs during the height of the Cold War. Niemeyer's Augustinianism straddles Gregory's "realist" and "civil liberalism" categories in a way deeper than that of Niebuhr.

Gregory has provided a compelling case for the centrality of love in political ethics, and the central role Augustine needs to play in future discussions. My reservations deal with the periphery of his argument, and serve only to push his analysis. He does himself a disservice in directing his book primarily to Augustinian liberals. Liberals of all stripes, and even non-liberals, need to read this book.

[1] I have provided my own interpretation of Augustine's theory of politics, which attempts to unite the perspective of statesman and citizen, in Augustine and Politics as Longing in the World (Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 2001), especially chapters 2-4. Gregory inexplicably views my effort as "Aristotelian" and infused by the approach of Leo Strauss (357n.83). Despite Gregory's own comparisons of Augustine and Aristotle (e.g., pp. 262, 358 [describing the best friendships as sharing "a love for wisdom"]), he seems to draw this conclusion from my willingness (which he supports) to attribute "casuistry" to Augustine's theory of ordo amoris (314). I think on key issues (coercion is an exception), Gregory's view of Augustine is closer to mine than he thinks, and appeals to alleged influences do little more than muddy the waters.

[2] J. S. Mill, On Liberty and Other Essays, ed., John Gray (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991), 73.

[3] For details, see my Augustine and Politics as Longing in the World, chapter 7.