Politics of Deconstruction: A New Introduction to Jacques Derrida

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Susanne Lüdemann, Politics of Deconstruction: A New Introduction to Jacques Derrida, Stanford University Press, 2014, 157pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804784139.

Reviewed by Diego Rossello, Pontificia Universidad Católica de Chile


Susanne Lüdemann has written an instructive and engaging book. Presented as a new introduction to the thought of Jacques Derrida, creator of the philosophical movement often dubbed deconstruction, the book offers a compelling reading of a representative sample of the philosopher's main works. Adding yet another volume to introductory works available on Derrida is no minor challenge, and in her Preface Lüdemann acknowledges the potential aporia of producing nuanced academic writing for non-specialist readers (x). Under the pressure of this aporia, her commitment to introductory writing often yields to the urge of a more sophisticated, and personal, reading of Derrida's oeuvre. In accordance with this urge, Lüdemann delivers a lucid analysis of Derrida's project that specialists will find rewarding, and non-specialists may find, at times, challenging.

Published in Germany by Junius Verlag in 2011 as Jacques Derrida zur Einführung, the English edition adds "new" and "politics of deconstruction" to the original German title. The allusion to the "politics of deconstruction" can mislead the reader into thinking that the book is a sustained discussion of the political dimension of Derrida's work. However, this is not the case; such discussion is mostly circumscribed to the second half of the book. The book itself consists of a revealing Preface, four main chapters, an Epilogue, a brief biographical note on Derrida included as an Appendix, and a selected bibliography of Derrida's most important works. The chronology of Derrida's life in the Appendix is extracted from the book Jacques Derrida, by Geoffrey Bennington and Derrida, published by the University of Chicago Press in 1993. It may have been better to refer readers to the authoritative biography of Derrida written by Benoit Peeters, published in French by Flammarion in 2010 -- and translated into English in 2012 -- already available when the original German edition of was published.

The preface offers insights into Lüdemann 's dilemmas about introductory writing. She argues that her introduction substitutes for neither the reading of Derrida's original texts nor the reading of other similar introductory works. On the contrary, she describes her book as offering one way among other "paths of one particular reading marked by the contingencies of academic and personal history" (x). Failing to acknowledge the responsibility of reading always from a certain perspective would be for Lüdemann "misrecognizing and betraying the object of commentary" (x). This acknowledgment notwithstanding, she is quick to clarify that the book is "not written without consideration of those for whom [the book] is intended," namely "students of the humanities, as well as parties within and outside the academy interested in philosophy and politics, who desire 'guidance'" (x). Thus, confronted with the rock of idiosyncratic reading, and the hard place of insipid commentary, Lüdemann chooses to clarify her commitments as an interpreter: her reading is inflected by a "German perspective" invested in finding a responsible way of philosophizing "after Auschwitz" (xiii).

Arranged in chronological order, the main chapters cover most of Derrida's career, from his 1954 dissertation The Problem of Genesis in Husserl's Philosophy, to the speech "A Europe of Hope" delivered in 2004 at the 50th anniversary celebration of Le Monde Diplomatique. The first chapter provides both a biographical and intellectual background from which to appreciate Derrida's theoretical breakthrough. The chapter includes a brief biographical sketch of Derrida as a child in a family of assimilated Sephardic Jews in Algeria, as well as a description of the climate of ideas at the time of his arrival at the École Normale Supérieure in 1952. Lüdemann registers the shift between the "Three-H Generation" (2) of French intellectuals influenced by Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger, existentialists, phenomenologists and structuralists, to the next generation, often associated with post-structuralism, shaped by three masters of suspicion, Marx, Nietzsche, and Freud. She also offers a succinct but sharp reconstruction of Martin Heidegger's existential analytics as well as of the linguistic turn provoked by the work of Ferdinand de Saussure.

Chapter two focuses on the early works by Derrida, mostly on Speech and Phenomena and Of Grammatology. Here Lüdemann discusses Derrida's critique of the metaphysics of presence and logocentrism. The two critiques are intertwined, she suggests, as the historic philosophical bias against writing favors not only the narcissistic illusion of speech's self-transparency, of a meaning fully present to itself in speech for consciousness, but also the idea of writing as a mere supplement of the spoken word. However, the sophisticated reconstruction of these critiques yields passages that are, at times, if not intricate, at least unfriendly to the non-specialized reader. Consider this example: "Therefore, self-consciousness, the state of being present-to-oneself, implies the self-sufficiency of ideal interiority coupled in a feedback loop with the signified" (31). The chapter also includes a brief and suggestive discussion of Derrida's critique of logocentrism, and the priority of the voice associated with it, framed as a critique of Eurocentrism. The European experience privileges phonographic writing due to the structure of the Greek and Latin languages. Hence, a Eurocentric perspective prioritizes, and takes as a symbol of civilization, systems of signification where the written word is conceived as the representation of sounds, in contradistinction to "ideographic or pictographic systems of writing" (38), often taken to be barbaric or uncivilized.

Chapters three and four fulfill the title's promise of an emphasis on the politics of deconstruction. The chapters follow the turn in Derrida's own work towards more explicitly political themes. Chapter three focuses primarily on the notions of justice and the gift, where Lüdemann discusses, on the one hand, Derrida's lecture "Force of Law", delivered in the famous 1989 colloquium "Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice", at the Cardozo Law School of Law; and the book Counterfeit Money, dedicated to a discussion of the notion of the gift in Marcel Mauss. In both cases Lüdemann finds Derrida struggling with the idea of the "undeconstructible", namely, with figures of the excessive, the incommensurable and the incalculable. For Lüdemann both justice and the gift can be conceived as examples of this excess and incalculability, as they resist and threaten to overcome a "cycle of economy" (75) that presupposes material and immaterial partition, distribution, reallocation and exchange. The way in which Lüdemann sees Derrida breaking with such a cycle is through the idea of the messianic promise.

Chapter four discusses the temporality of the political in Derrida, his critique of the fraternal bond, and the notion of autoimmunity. In the first section, Lüdemann offers a lucid commentary on the notion of inheritance laid out by Derrida in Specters of Marx. The question of inheritance already presupposes the problem of the proper, of property and its existence and transmission through time. Derrida seemed worried about neoliberal calls for sending Marx and Marxism to the dustbin of history, and remind us that, as Lüdemann puts it, "we are the heirs of the best (of an emancipatory promise . . . historically connected with the political form of democracy)" and also heirs of the worst of Marxism "(totalitarianism, wars, the camps of the Second World War)" (87). In this sense Lüdemann proposes that Derrida is calling for "assuming responsibility for this inheritance" (87). Her commentary on Derrida's post-fraternal conception of democracy, as well as on the deconstruction of the proper (the people, the citizen, the nation, language, Europe, etc.) and the foreign, in the notion of auto-immunity, are also nuanced and engaging.

In the epilogue, Lüdemann reviews the intricacies of Derrida's relation with America. She points out that Derrida held positions at several American universities beginning in the 1970's.  During that time he wrote favoring America as a critic of Eurocentrism and against America's new role in the new world order. Other vignettes of Derrida's complex engagement with America reviewed by Lüdemann are his confrontation with Anglo-American analytic philosophy, famously in his polemic on the legacy of J. L. Austin with John Searle, as well as in alliance with other American anti-essentialist discourses, such as the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty.

To sum up, this is an informative, lucid and engaging volume that theorists in the critical humanities will find rewarding. However, the book's main virtue is also its vice: the sophisticated and personal reading is often unfriendly to non-specialist audiences who are arguably the main target of an introductory volume. It is also worth noticing that the book does not include a discussion of the "animal turn" in Derrida, and therefore neither the notion of carno-centrism, nor Derrida's impact on animal studies are included in the commentary. Although it could be argued that these themes are not explicitly political, it can be suggested that Derrida did think so as he explored the notion of the animal and the beast as a form of interrogation of the foundations of political authority, in particular in his 2001-2003 seminar on "The Beast and the Sovereign". This critique notwithstanding, Lüdemann's volume stands as a fine addition to the growing secondary literature on Derrida's fascinating theoretical project.


The reviewer would like to acknowledge the financial support of FONDECYT (Project 11130663).