Politics, Religion, and Art: Hegelian Debates

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Douglas Moggach (ed.), Politics, Religion, and Art: Hegelian Debates, Northwestern University Press, 2011, 360pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810127296.

Reviewed by Jason Miller, Rice University


It has become a hallmark of any historically oriented philosophical text to justify its publication by way of promising a unique and timely revaluation of an important moment of intellectual history that has been previously misunderstood, misrepresented, or woefully neglected by the scholarly tradition. The novel insight usually takes the form of a revisionist narrative of a philosophical era, a re-examination of its principal figures and debates, or a retrieval of past ideas for present and relevant purposes. Rarely do such texts actually deliver on such grand promises. However, a recent collection of essays edited by Douglas Moggach titled Politics, Religion, and Art: Hegelian Debates, actually does . . . for the most part.

At a time when scholarship in Hegel's philosophy has at last emerged from the darker days of logical positivism and regained interest and vitality, Moggach's text provides the most intricate assessment to date of the early Hegelians -- the figures beyond Hegel that comprise the whole of Hegelian philosophy. Against the prevailing tendency to chart the trajectory of nineteenth-century philosophy directly from Hegel to Marx, Moggach makes it his principal editorial imperative not only to catalogue the contributions of otherwise marginal or interim figures of German idealism, but to highlight these contributions as integral to the formation and development of the central "Hegelian debates." As Moggach explains, a central aim of this volume is "to establish the importance of these early Hegelians as creative contributors to foundational debates about modernity, state, and society; as innovators in the fields of theology, aesthetics, and ethics, whose work has been underestimated and requires reassessment" (p. 5). Indeed, the text reads as a virtual Festschrift to the unsung heroes of post-Hegelian philosophy, including, among others, David Friedrich Strauss, Bruno Bauer, Arnold Ruge, Eduard Gans, Ludwig Feuerbach, Karl Rosenkrantz, and Max Stirner.

This volume features an impressive selection of contemporary international scholars, such as Paul Redding, Jon Stewart, Myriam Bienenstock, Frederick Beiser, Tom Rockmore, and others. Included are fifteen essays, divided in the table of contents among five major categories: 1) Foundations; 2) Religion, Politics, Freedom; 3) Politics, Civil Society, Ethics; 4) Art and the Modern World; and 5) Appropriations and Critiques of Hegel. As indicated in the book's title, the discussions accord with broader themes of the Hegelian debates under consideration, namely, politics, religion, and art. As one proceeds through the essays themselves, however, one discerns a clear emphasis on the political significance of these early Hegelian debates. No fewer than half of the essays address the politics or political implications of early Hegelianism. Where these issues are not of direct significance, they are addressed indirectly, in the context of various religious and moral debates.

Of course, equal representation is by no means an editorial requirement of a text devoted to post-Hegelian debates, which were decidedly political in nature, regardless of their specific content. In fact, the political essays are the ones that best accomplish the text's objective, namely, to provide a more refined and contextualized understanding of the philosophical debates leading up to the failed Revolutions of 1848 in Germany, the period known as the Vormärz. In his essay on the Left Hegelians' role in the Christian German state, for example, Warren Breckman offers an insightful deconstruction of modern democracy in terms of the theological debates about the concept of personality that took place among the early Hegelians. He argues that these debates provided the political momentum for the liberal ideal of a secular, egalitarian, "disembodied" state power in opposition to a centralized Prussian authority.

In a similar work, Norbert Waszek examines the formidable influence of early Hegelians on contemporary theories of political opposition. Challenging the conventional view that such a theory is not available in Hegel, he demonstrates the influential role of Eduard Gans in advancing core principles of Hegel's Philosophy of Right within these debates. Gans, who is typically cast in the shadow of his student, Karl Marx, is also the focus of Bienenstock's essay on the "social question" -- the problem of extreme disparity between wealth and poverty -- that became a focus of post-Hegelian political philosophy. By locating the issue within the broader context of the revolutionary momentum that French Saint-Simonism was gaining in Germany, Bienenstock reveals in Gans' appropriation of Hegel a response to the social question that is more practical, and potentially more promising, than the familiar response found in Marx.

Yet, in notable contrast to the richness and depth of the political and theologico-political debates contained in this volume, disappointingly, the section on art comprises only two essays. This is surprising in view of Hegel's inclusion of art within the realm of Absolute Spirit as a more dialectically advanced form of self-awareness than the political domain of Objective Spirit. This gives the impression that, after Hegel, the question of art's philosophical status becomes consigned to the margins of these debates. However, this contradicts both the general objective of the text as well as Moggach's specific claim that, for the early Hegelians, "the linkage between art and the forms of objective spirit . . . is accorded great stress, and art itself is seen as proof of the effectiveness of reason in reshaping the material order" (p. 8). But the focus of the work is clearly politics, which, again, is not in itself a fault, though a more accurate title for the volume might have read: "Politics and Other Hegelian Debates."

Anchoring the various debates discussed in this volume is a heightened sensitivity to, and justifiable skepticism of, the division of Hegelian philosophy into so-called "Left" and "Right" schools of thought. Though such divisions took shape during Hegel's lifetime, it was David Friedrich Strauss who, in defending his highly-criticized theological publication, The Life of Jesus (1835), identified and articulated the development of "Left," "Right," and "Center" positions within early post-Hegelian thought. Originally, the distinctions were meant to reflect the competing interpretations of Hegel's conception of spirit, or Geist, in accordance (respectively) with Christian metaphysics, secular humanism, or a middle position between the two. But, as Moggach rightly stresses in his Introduction, this theological schism soon perpetuates radical interpretive fragmentation along the Left-Right divide in the political, philosophical, and cultural spheres of Hegelian thought. The essays in this volume not only recognize the difficulties that these traditional categories present for a modern understanding of Hegelian philosophy, but take an unprecedented initiative to unravel the theoretical and ideological complexities that constitute these divisions.

Particularly illuminating in this regard is a collaborative essay by Wolfgang Bunzel and Lars Lambrecht which maps the previously uncharted historical and conceptual topography of early Hegelianism throughout the politically volatile Vormärz period in Germany. Behind the oversimplified designations of "Left" and "Right" Hegelianism, they present the intellectual landscape of this period as comprised of numerous ideological "group formations" that materialize and dissolve in response to a set of highly contingent circumstances, such as regional affiliation, nationalist sentiment, intellectual circles, and various cults of personality. Moreover, they track these factional developments through the polemical warfare that took place between rival philosophical publications such as the Hallische Jahrbücher, Litterarische Zeitung, and the Rheinische Zeitung (edited by the young Karl Marx), thereby lending coherence to the narrative of ambiguous and overlapping allegiances, both philosophical and political, that define early Hegelianism.

Similarly, Stewart challenges conventional wisdom about Left and Right Hegelianism by drawing on a host of lesser-known voices within the canonical religious debates that spawned such division. These include, in particular, questions of individual immortality, Christology, and later manifestations of the famous Pantheism controversy that engulfed early Kantian philosophy. In place of the standard Left-Right posturing, he offers a detailed constellation of divergent positions within these debates that allows us not only to address more adequately later criticisms of Hegel (e.g., Kierkegaard's), but also to gain a better sense of how these debates anticipate important philosophical issues of the twentieth century (e.g., existentialism).

Now, to return to my earlier point: given the significance that Moggach and his contributors attach to a more robust understanding of Left and Right divisions in early Hegelian philosophy, it is all the more unfortunate that so little attention is devoted to the debates concerning Hegel's philosophy of art. Hegel's aesthetic theory is the singular dimension of his thought that remains more or less immune to deep interpretive division, and so it provides an interesting and important anomaly to the standard Left-vs.-Right paradigm these authors are challenging. Compared to the arenas of political or religious thought discussed in the text, there are no real "Left" and "Right" schools of Hegelian aesthetics to speak of.

In her insightful essay, "The Aesthetics of the Hegelian School," Bernadette Collenberg-Plotnikov provides a rich account of the conflicting attitudes that developed in response to the lectures on art given late in Hegel's life at the University of Berlin. But her attempt to discern from these attitudes distinctly Left and Right schools of thought seems to force the narrative somewhat. It is certainly true that Heinrich Gustav Hotho, Hegel's student and editor of the posthumously published Lectures on Fine Art, sought a more systematic and metaphysical -- and in this sense, conservative or "rightist" -- presentation of Hegel's views on art. But Hotho hardly represents a "school" of thought; he acted more or less alone in advancing Hegelian aesthetics through both the publication of Hegel's lectures and the development of his own aesthetic theory in Vorstudien für Leben und Kunst (1833). The opposing "leftist" anti-metaphysical, politically-oriented view of art that she attributes to Arnold Ruge can in fact be attributed to his contemporaries and subsequent generations of Hegelian aesthetics. Moreover, the supporting claim that Hotho manipulates the text to reflect his own rightist aesthetic agenda is far from "proven," as she maintains (p. 210), and in fact it represents the view of a relatively minor group of skeptics in contemporary Hegelian scholarship (including, most notably, Annamarie Gethmann-Siefert and Otto Pöggeler). Collenberg-Plotnikov certainly presents an informed and insightful exposition of the early reception of Hegelian aesthetics. But rather than artificially extrapolating a Left-Right dichotomy from these generalizations, it might have been more fruitful to show how these characteristics of Hegelian aesthetics uniquely fail to map onto traditional distinctions and thus problematize the left-right categories in interesting and challenging ways.

Speaking more generally, we can say without reservation that the text succeeds in its attempt to challenge and refine a contemporary understanding of the philosophical debates among Hegelians of the 1830s. The essays' collective attention to, and careful analysis of, the myriad political, religious, and philosophical currents at work in these debates present the reader with a more fine-grained image of the period of intellectual activity in Germany that unfolded between the success of Hegel's philosophy and the failure of the 1848 revolutions. Yet, for all the scholarly effort that goes into gerrymandering the conceptual and ideological boundaries of Hegelian philosophy more accurately, it is unclear in the final analysis what conclusions we can draw regarding the present.

Beyond its goal of providing a revisionary historical analysis, the book aims to allow for a "powerful diagnosis of modernity" and "a new evaluation of the relevance of Hegelian thought to contemporary issues in political philosophy." This comes out in several of the essays, but, on the whole, there is a notable disconnect between scholarly diligence and current purchase power of the text. Of course, philosophical diagnosis of our current predicament certainly depends in part on a proper understanding of important historical precedents, but the connection is not explicit. Indeed, the prominent philosophical historian Frederick Beiser consciously avoids making this connection in his essay on the forgotten figure of Max Stirner, noting that, "The task of the present chapter is not to discuss his relevance for contemporary philosophy but to provide an introduction to the basic themes of his thought" (p. 283). And without clear indication of how the historical/philosophical objective of the text coincides with the contemporary/practical, this volume, while invaluable to contemporary scholarship on Hegel, may have trouble generating broader appeal.