Ponderings II-VI: Black Notebooks 1931-1938

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Martin Heidegger, Ponderings II-VI: Black Notebooks 1931-1938, Richard Rojcewicz (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2016, 388pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253020673.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


Those who follow Heidegger's stream of posthumous publications have no doubt heard of the ominous "Black Notebooks," a series of texts that range from the 1930s to the 1970s. Thus far, four volumes have been published in German: Gesamtausgabe (GA) vols. 94-96 in 2014 and vol. 97 in 2015. In addition to the general term "Black Notebooks," which literally refers to the color of the documents' binding, the texts were divided by Heidegger into several series that bear vague titles such as Überlegungen and Anmerkungen. We now have Richard Rojcewicz's English translation of volume 94, comprising Überlegungen II-VI, from the years 1931-1938. (The whereabouts of Überlegungen I are unknown, and some of these notebooks also have subsidiary titles.) Translations of volumes 95 and 96, also by Rojcewicz, are on their way, and Adam Knowles is working on volume 97.

As editor Peter Trawny puts it, the Black Notebooks might be classified as a Denktagebuch, a journal of pensées or "idea diary" (384). Most entries reflect on broad characteristics of the times and attempt to interpret them in terms of what Heidegger called the history of being. The tone is more personal than in most of Heidegger's writings, and the first-person singular appears much more frequently here, but this is not a conventional diary; one very rarely gets a sense of what he was doing on any particular day, although there are occasional descriptions of weather and landscape (e.g. 237) or flashes of childhood memories (e.g. 354).

The word Überlegungen refers to trains of thought that contemplate practical or theoretical problems; it has dignified and quite unfunny connotations, like the English "considerations" or "deliberations." In contrast, the label Ponderings cannot fail to provoke chuckles. Heidegger's ruminations may well be ponderous and pompous, but the reader should not be pushed toward that conclusion by a title that seems as tin-eared as the misbegotten term "enowning" that was foisted on us by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly in their 1999 translation of Contributions to Philosophy. Fortunately, Rojcewicz usually shows better sense; in fact, he is the co-translator with Daniela Vallega-Neu of a far more acceptable version of the Contributions that appeared in 2012.[1] I sometimes found the translation of Ponderings awkward, disagreed with particular readings, or was taken aback by pseudo-words such as "fortuitiveness" (46), but Rojcewicz is right to say that Heidegger's own style tends toward the "cryptic" and "stilted" (vii). In general, Rojcewicz has done a good job of making these journals available in English.

Now to the content: a widespread rumor asserts that the Black Notebooks certify Heidegger as an anti-Semite and a convinced Nazi. It is more accurate to say that he comes across as an initially excited, yet apprehensive participant in the Nazi movement; then as an embittered observer; and always as a nonconformist whose conception of the potential greatness of the revolution is abstruse and elusive.

As for Heidegger's anti-Semitism, some appalling statements he makes about "world Jewry" have been widely quoted as evidence. Readers may be surprised, then, to find that there are no references to Jews in this first volume, apart from a lone, late, parenthetical criticism of the Judeo-Christian view of humanity (345). The poisonous passages begin in the following volume; they include nasty characterizations of some particular Jews and references to the supposedly uprooted and uprooting character of global Judaism. In sum, the comments on Jews from volumes 94-97, together with their context, run to about ten pages.[2] Obviously, Heidegger did not write obsessively on the topic, and in a postwar "note for jackasses" (that would be us) he denies that his thoughts on Jews have anything to do with anti-Semitism, which is "foolish and abominable" (GA 97: 159). However, it is safe to say that his remarks reveal an antipathy to Jews, whether or not they are anti-Semitic in a narrow sense. That antipathy may run deep, and may be connected in a systematic way to Heidegger's philosophical orientation; a number of commentators have made cases for such a connection.[3] We should also remember that when he served as rector of the University of Freiburg in 1933-34, Heidegger promptly instituted the pro-"Aryan" measures decreed by the new regime and, in a lecture course, expressed an odious thought on the necessary "annihilation" of the internal enemies of the Volk.[4]

This first volume includes a set of entries from that fateful year as rector (81-119), which are required reading on Heidegger's political engagement. However, those who are hoping for concrete explanations of his behavior at the time will be disappointed. He offers us nebulous emotions that are rarely tied to particular events, and ambiguous and abstract reflections that can play into the hands of both his enemies and his defenders, without settling the controversy one way or the other.

An atmosphere of tense, unspecified anticipation begins before the rectorate. Convinced that his times lack a sense of "affliction" and "plight" (e.g. 67), Heidegger writes that "what matters [is] to open up the world-place" (71). He longs for a "power of world-formation" (24) and "the empowerment of being" (27) by way of "liberat[ing] the Da-sein in today's humanity" (34). He imagines "a decisive attitude that does not remain empty and formal but [grounds] the truth of beings in quite determinate horizons of vision and spheres of action" (19) -- but he does not name any particulars. The passage is reminiscent of Karl Löwith's report that in the 1920s, Heidegger's students used to joke, "I am resolved, only towards what I don't know."[5]

The mood is also nationalist, as if a heritage could provide resoluteness with a content. "Only someone who is German [der Deutsche] can . . . poetize being" (21). The Germans should dare to get involved in "the happening of being" (72). Heidegger fancies himself boden-ständig (translated here as "indigenous" or standing on "native soil"), "as if I went over the fields guiding a plow, or over lonely field-paths . . . which kept mother's blood, and that of her ancestors, circulating and pulsing" (29). Or in more metaphysical terms: "here is the originary limit of history -- not the empty super-temporal eternity -- instead, the steadfastness of rootedness" (29).

The excitement mounts: "The world is in reconstruction; mankind is awakening" (48). "A marvelously awakening communal [volklich] will is penetrating the great darkness of the world" (80). However, Heidegger has his reservations: rootedness does not guarantee a new empowerment of being, and individuality should not be absorbed into community (30). True community requires "aloneness" (45).

Heidegger seems to have a presentiment of risk and even of disaster, but he bucks himself up: "Only if we . . . actually go into errancy, can we strike up against 'truth'" (10).[6] "Staunchly into the ineluctable!" (26). He begins to think that there is a role for him to play in history: a philosopher can contribute indirectly to "the grounding of humans in soil -- work -- struggle" (63).

When he accepts the position of rector, he worries that he is "acting for the first time against my innermost voice" (81). We can only wonder how Heidegger's life and thought would have evolved if, like Socrates, he had obeyed his daimonion. Instead, he takes the plunge, and his journals express a steely resoluteness: "the Führer [gives] our thinking the correct course and impetus"; we must be "relentless in the hard goal" (81).

But what exactly is this goal? Heidegger is unwilling to articulate it in terms of the prevalent slogans and programs. "National Socialism is a genuine nascent power only if it still has something to withhold behind all its activity and talk . . . if the present were already that which is to be attained and striven for, then only a dread of the downfall would be left over." "National Socialism not a ready-made eternal truth come down from heaven -- taken in that way, it is an aberration and foolishness" (84). The ascendant Nazi "ideology" (104) or "phraseology" (112) is "a confused worldview" based on "the most problematic means of the nineteenth century" (94), such as "a dismal biologism" (105, cf. 115). This is just "cheap dogmatics" and "semblant philosophy" (95), "merely a Marxism set on its head" (116).

Instead, Heidegger seeks what in 1935 he will notoriously call "the inner truth and greatness" of Nazism, as opposed to its external trappings.[7] Heidegger occasionally calls this secret potential a "metapolitics" (e.g. 85); it aims at "a completely other being" (88), "a transformation of being" (92), or "the historical greatness of the people in the effectuation and configuration of the powers of being" (100). Such a transformation requires a "spiritual nobility" (89) that will foster "the people's knowledge" (90). (One must remember here that geistig or "spiritual" is not a specifically religious term but refers to the entire range of human thought and creativity.) This project is tied to Heidegger's philosophy: "the projection of being qua time" can indicate a "mission" that "first opens and binds blood and soil to a preparedness for action and to a capacity for work and for effectivity" (93). What this all means to the reader will depend on one's interpretation of the word "being," as well as on which actions one imagines Heidegger has in mind.

It is important to identify the enemy (91, 104, 107, 108), and that enemy must be confronted on the "spiritual" level. Heidegger singles out "the worlds of Christianity, of socialism as communism, and . . . modern Enlightenment-science" (96), which all must be combated philosophically. He repeatedly writes that what is needed is "knowledge cultivation" (Wissenserziehung, e.g. 92). However, "what dominates . . . is an aversion to all spirit which had previously been misinterpreted as intellectualism" (96). In short, even though a "spiritual National Socialism [is] necessary" (99), there is little or no room for thinking within the Nazi movement. Before the rectorate, Heidegger had sneered at "the writing of the thickest possible books" (41) and opined that "it bodes well for the future that German youths deeply reject 'philosophy' and 'science'" (42). But in the face of the crude reality of anti-intellectualism (the book burnings, not mentioned here, began in May 1933), he sours on the student movement: the students "are essentially not at the age of creative maturity with regard to the spirit and worldview" (117).

By the end of Heidegger's term as rector the mood has changed to bitterness, as he gives up on the idea that he can work within a dogmatic and authoritarian system. "We will remain in the invisible front of the secret spiritual Germany" (114). He pens a resignation speech (surely never delivered) in which he admits he has failed, but consoles himself with the idea that "foundering is the highest form of human experience" (118).

This all makes for absorbing reading, yet it remains frustratingly vague. The Black Notebooks reflect the moods of Heidegger's rectorate; the public documents from 1933-34 consist of bureaucratic directives and exhortatory speeches.[8] We are left wanting specific analyses and rationales that might link the moods and the pronouncements to a more clearly articulated long-term goal. In short, true Überlegungen are absent. Unless such deliberations appear someday, say in Heidegger's still largely unpublished correspondence, we are forced to speculate. Was there a particular result that he wanted to achieve? Or was he excited by the revolutionary upheaval and the possibility of creative transformation, without any concrete sense of what might come about?

A melancholy, if not sour mood predominates in the remainder of this book (and in subsequent volumes). Heidegger never tires of exposing what he sees as the pettiness, blindness, and metaphysical bankruptcy of every phenomenon around him, from the worship of "purely physical virility (brutality)" (134) to the "banality of . . . American pragmatism" (140) to "the ascendancy of Catholicism" (136). On this last point, Heidegger sees any turn to Christianity as a deluded "escape" from the modern predicament (31); Western history is unthinkable without Christianity, but its creative power is long gone and "the great decisions do not occur there" (380).

The picture is bleak: "The world is now out of joint; the earth is a field of destruction" (160). The only hope is "to learn great joy in little things" (233) while we await the dawn: the world "is no longer a world, or, said more truly -- it never was a world. We are standing only in its preparation" (154). In a particularly despairing and misanthropic moment Heidegger asks, "What does it signify that the human masses are not even worthy anymore of being annihilated at one blow?" (207).[9]

Heidegger's hostility extends to the predominant Nazi ideology, and develops the misgivings that he had expressed early on. (Readers should know that throughout the Black Notebooks, the harsh comments on Nazis far outnumber those on Jews.) Even before his rectorate, Heidegger is suspicious of artificial ideals or myths (67); he fulminates against "the fabrication of a . . . 'worldview'" based on the Nietzschean metaphysics of strength (58). Successful Nazi ideologues such as Ernst Krieck are "mouthers of mediocrity" (179, trans. modified) who are cooking up a "witches' cauldron" of "political worldview, concocted paganism, perplexity, idolization of technology, idolization of race, worship of Wagner, etc, etc." (191). "Political science," i.e. research that is subordinated to the Nazi program, is harming Germany both externally (and "not only with regard to emigrés") and internally (140). "Where a people posits itself as its own goal, egoism has expanded into the gigantic. . . . All this is radically un-German" (171).

Race, as part of "thrownness," is a real condition of existence, but it is "elevated to the unconditioned" (139) by Nazi racism. "Those who want to breed the people 'biologically'" (266) are carrying out an "animalization and mechanization of the people" (163). Nazism, as "the machinational organization of the people," is essentially technological, which means that it can never freely command technology itself: what "in essence is already a slave can never become master" (343).

Although Heidegger's criticisms of Nazism are substantial, we should not be too quick to acquit him. These are the grumblings of a disappointed lover; he clings to "the inner truth" of National Socialism, its hidden potential that only he could have properly articulated. In 1934, after stepping down as rector, he takes Nazism to be essentially a "barbaric principle," but claims that this is precisely where "its possible greatness" lies (142). Later he writes that although the völkisch world view is superficial, it also has its necessity (324). And since Nazism expresses the modern technological era, it is "not a possible object of a short-sighted 'opposition'"; it calls for "creative meditation, which . . . can think only in terms of centuries" (343).

Even when Heidegger has reached the conclusion, by the late 1930s, that Nazism is the ultimate form of modern nihilism, he tells himself that the movement must be "affirm[ed] . . . on thoughtful grounds" (GA 95: 408). His reasoning seems to be that modernity must be played out to its "essential consequences" (GA 95: 431) so that it may experience a tragic and catastrophic collapse, an Untergang (translated by Rojcewicz with the overliteral "downgoing"). A collapse that is "necessary and is affiliated to the history of being" (349) may make a new beginning possible (203). So it cannot be said that Heidegger resists Nazism, despite his metaphysical critique of it.[10]

Is Heidegger a Nazi philosopher? "'Philosophy' must never demean itself to the task and demand of either erecting a 'worldview' or 'grounding' and 'configuring' one that already prevails" (219). "To say a philosophy is 'National Socialist,' or is not so, means the same as to say a triangle is courageous, or is not so -- and therefore is cowardly" (254, cf. 370).

Not everything in this volume is political, at least not obviously so. For instance, Heidegger sketches his critique of Western metaphysics and proposes that the question of being should be oriented not by "the 'it is,' but [by] the 'let it be' (thrown projection)" (37-39). He asserts that "absence as beenness and as future" is "richer" than presence (61). He blames himself for the shortcomings of the unfinished Being and Time: "the author himself stupidly held back the main point!" and let the book be taken as "philosophy of existence" à la Kierkegaard (57). Remarks such as this are of philosophical interest -- but they do not present ideas that have no parallels in Heidegger's more polished work, and for those who have not studied that work, they will be baffling.

Some critics have suggested that since the Black Notebooks are among the last volumes of the Gesamtausgabe to see the light of day, they represent the capstone of Heidegger's philosophical edifice. This is a dubious claim. Heidegger himself calls the notebooks "attempts at simple designation [Nennen] -- not statements [much less] sketches for a planned system" (1). As Rojcewicz puts it, these are "notes to self" (vii). Still, it is clear that Heidegger himself thought the notebooks had some value. He obviously reread them, adding some cross-references and compiling partial indexes. He even published a few excerpts in 1954.[11] The notebooks provide glimpses of feelings and thoughts that are not evident in his more exoteric writings, such as the lecture courses (which he calls a "mask," 178, cf. 189). Even in the notebooks, however, one often gets the sense that Heidegger is writing from "a great reticence" (22) and we are seeing only the tip of the iceberg; the very "essence of being," he writes, is "a taciturnity that conceals" (40). What we have here are allusions, not patient explications.

One could plausibly argue that the Black Notebooks are not philosophy at all, but a collection of attitudes and opinions. However, there is rarely a well-demarcated border between an individual's philosophical and unphilosophical views. For those who want to understand where Heidegger was 'coming from,' and how, as he saw it, his abstract ideas related to his own times, the Notebooks are indispensable reading. This is not to say that the reading is pleasant. Many will find these texts relentlessly negative, tiresomely self-important -- and, yes, ponderous.[12]

Inevitably, the Black Notebooks appeal to our curiosity about the man Martin Heidegger, and provide material for biographical and psychological theories. But something more is at stake than the vices or virtues of an individual. Thoughts with a philosophical dimension cannot simply be "explained through a bringing in of the 'personal'" (239). On this point, I will give Heidegger the last words:

The strength of a work is measured by the extent to which it refutes its creator -- i.e., grounds something altogether different [from] that on which its creator himself stood and had to stand. Therefore, all 'biography,' 'psychology,' 'biology,' and 'sociology' are null and void for the work and its 'effectiveness.' The latter does not at all consist in being understood, if that means: explainable out of the sphere of what is intelligible to an epoch (318).

The "frivolous hunt" for "anthropological presuppositions" apparently "suffices to refute a philosophy -- e.g., that of Kant -- without one ever undertaking the exertion required to involve oneself in the actual work of thought and in the paths of that work, paths that never terminate, since they lead into the abyss" (345).

[1] See my review.

[3] The rapidly growing literature in English on the topic includes Trawny, Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, trans. Andrew J. Mitchell (University of Chicago Press, 2015); Ingo Farin and Jeff Malpas (eds.), Reading Heidegger's Black Notebooks 1931-1941 (MIT Press, 2016); and Mitchell and Trawny (eds.), Heidegger's Black Notebooks: Responses to Anti-Semitism (Columbia University Press, forthcoming).

[4] Heidegger, Being and Truth, trans. Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (Indiana University Press, 2010), 73.

[5] Löwith, My Life in Germany Before and After 1933: A Report, trans. Elizabeth King ( University of Illinois Press, 1994), 30.

[6] On the theme of "errancy" see Trawny, Freedom to Fail: Heidegger's Anarchy, trans. Ian Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner (Polity, 2015).

[7] Heidegger, Introduction to Metaphysics, trans. Fried and Polt, 2nd ed. (Yale University Press, 2014), 222.

[8] The documents are collected in Reden und andere Zeugnisse eines Lebensweges, GA 16 (Vittorio Klostermann, 2000) and in Alfred Denker and Holger Zaborowski (eds.), Heidegger und der Nationalsozialismus I: Dokumente, Heidegger-Jahrbuch 4 (Karl Alber, 2009).

[9] Translation modified. Rojcewicz takes the text to mean, "are worth so little they could be annihilated in one stroke."

[10] I retract the subtitle of my article "Beyond Power and Struggle: Heidegger's Secret Resistance," Interpretation 35:1 (Fall 2007): 11-40.

[11] "Aus der Erfahrung des Denkens," in Aus der Erfahrung des Denkens, GA 13 (Vittorio Klostermann, 1983), 75-86; "The Thinker as Poet," in Poetry, Language, Thought, trans. Albert Hofstadter (Harper and Row, 1971), 1-14.

[12] For an example of a negative reaction to the Notebooks, see David Farrell Krell, Ecstasy, Catastrophe: Heidegger from Being and Time to the Black Notebooks (SUNY Press, 2015).